Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Cognitive science is the interdisciplinary study of mind and
intelligence, embracing philosophy, psychology, artificial
intelligence, neuroscience, linguistics, and anthropology. Its
intellectual origins are in the mid-1950s when researchers in several
fields began to develop theories of mind based on complex
representations and computational procedures. Its organizational
origins are in the mid-1970s when the Cognitive Science Society was
formed and the journal Cognitive Science began. Since then, more than
sixty universities in North America and Europe have established
cognitive science programs and many others have instituted courses in
Attempts to understand the mind and its operation go back at least to
the Ancient Greeks, when philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle
tried to explain the nature of human knowledge. The study of mind
remained the province of philosophy until the nineteenth century, when
experimental psychology developed. Wilhelm Wundt and his students
initiated laboratory methods for studying mental operations more
systematically. Within a few decades, however, experimental
psychology became dominated by behaviorism, a view that virtually
denied the existence of mind. According to behaviorists such as J. B.
Watson, psychology should restrict itself to examining the relation
between observable stimuli and observable behavioral responses. Talk
of consciousness and mental representations was banished from
respectable scientific discussion. Especially in North America,
behaviorism dominated the psychological scene through the 1950s.
Around 1956, the intellectual landscape began to change dramatically.
George Miller summarized numerous studies which showed that the
capacity of human thinking is limited, with short-term memory, for
example, limited to around seven items. He proposed that memory
limitations can be overcome by recoding information into chunks,
mental representations that require mental procedures for encoding and
decoding the information. At this time, primitive computers had been
around for only a few years, but pioneers such as John McCarthy,
Marvin Minsky, Allen Newell, and Herbert Simon were founding the field
of artificial intelligence. In addition, Noam Chomsky rejected
behaviorist assumptions about language as a learned habit and proposed
instead to explain language comprehension in terms of mental grammars
consisting of rules. The six thinkers mentioned in this paragraph can
be viewed as the founders of cognitive science.
The central hypothesis of cognitive science is that thinking can best
be understood in terms of representational structures in the mind and
computational procedures that operate on those structures. While
there is much disagreement about the nature of the representations and
computations that constitute thinking, the central hypothesis is
general enough to encompass the current range of thinking in cognitive
science, including connectionist theories which model thinking using
artificial neural networks.
Most work in cognitive science assumes that the mind has mental
representations analogous to computer data structures, and
computational procedures similar to computational algorithms.
Cognitive theorists have proposed that the mind contains such mental
representations as logical propositions, rules, concepts, images, and
analogies, and that it uses mental procedures such as deduction,
search, matching, rotating, and retrieval. The dominant mind-computer
analogy in cognitive science has taken on a novel twist from the use
of another analog, the brain. Connectionists have proposed novel
ideas about representation and computation that use neurons and their
connections as inspirations for data structures, and neuron firing and
spreading activation as inspirations for algorithms. Cognitive
science then works with a complex 3-way analogy among the mind, the
brain, and computers. Mind, brain, and computation can each be used
to suggest new ideas about the others. There is no single
computational model of mind, since different kinds of computers and
programming approaches suggest different ways in which the mind might
work. The computers that most of us work with today are serial
processors, performing one instruction at a time, but the brain and
some recently developed computers are parallel processors, capable of
doing many operations at once.
Philosophy, in particular philosophy of mind, is part of cognitive
science. But the interdisciplinary field of cognitive science is
relevant to philosophy in several ways. First, the psychological,
computational, and other results of cognitive science investigations
have important potential applications to traditional philosophical
problems in epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics. Second, cognitive
science can serve as an object of philosophical critique, particularly
concerning the central assumption that thinking is representational
and computational. Third and more constructively, cognitive science
can taken as an object of investigation in the philosophy of science,
generating reflections on the methodology and presuppositions of the
1. Philosophical Applications
Much philosophical research today is naturalistic, treating
philosophical investigations as continuous with empirical work in
fields such as psychology. From a naturalistic perspective,
philosophy of mind is closely allied with theoretical and experimental
work in cognitive science. Metaphysical conclusions about the nature
of mind are to be reached, not by a priori speculation, but by
informed reflection on scientific developments in fields such as
computer science and neuroscience. Similarly, epistemology is not a
stand-alone conceptual exercise, but depends on and benefits from
scientific findings concerning mental structures and learning
procedures. Even ethics can benefit by using greater understanding of
the psychology of moral thinking to bear on ethical questions such as
the nature of deliberations concerning right and wrong. Goldman
(1993) provides a concise review of applications of cognitive science
to epistemology, philosophy of science, philosophy of mind,
metaphysics, and ethics.
2. Critique of Cognitive Science
The claim that human minds work by representation and computation
is an empirical conjecture and might be wrong. Although the
computational-representational approach to cognitive science has been
successful in explaining many aspects of human problem solving,
learning, and language use, some philosophical critics such as Hubert
Dreyfus and John Searle have claimed that this approach is
fundamentally mistaken. Critics of cognitive science have offered
such challenges as:
Thagard (1996) argues that all these challenges can best be met by
expanding and supplementing the computational-representational
approach, not by abandoning it.
- 1. The emotion challenge: Cognitive science neglects the
important role of emotions in human thinking.
- 2. The consciousness challenge: Cognitive science ignores the
importance of consciousness in human thinking.
- 3. The world challenge: Cognitive science disregards the
significant role of physical environments in human thinking.
- 4. The social challenge: Human thought is inherently social in
ways that cognitive science ignores.
- 5. The dynamical systems challenge: The mind is a dynamical system,
not a computational system.
- 6. The mathematics challenge: Mathematical results show that human
thinking cannot be computational in the standard sense, so the brain
must operate differently, perhaps as a quantum computer.
3. Philosophy of Cognitive Science
Cognitive science raises many interesting methodological questions
that are worthy of investigation by philosophers of science. What is
the nature of representation? What role do computational models play
in the development of cognitive theories? What is the relation among
apparently competing accounts of mind involving symbolic processing,
neural networks, and dynamical systems? Von Eckardt (1993) provides a
good discussion of some of the philosophical issues that arise in
mind: philosophy of
- Goldman, A. (1993). Philosophical Applications of Cognitive
Science. Boulder: Westview Press.
- Johnson-Laird, P., (1988). The Computer and the Mind: An
Introduction to Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: Harvard
- Stillings, N., et al., (1995). Cognitive Science. Second
edition. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- Thagard, P., (1996).
Mind: Introduction to Cognitive Science,
Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
- von Eckardt, B. (1993). What is Cognitive Science? Cambridge,
MA: MIT Press.
Copyright © 1996 by
Table of Contents
First published: September 23, 1996
Content last modified: September 23, 1996