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As an academic subject, the philosophy of childhood has sometimes been included within the philosophy of education. Recently, however, philosophers have begun to offer college and university courses specifically in the philosophy of childhood. And philosophical literature on childhood is increasing in both quantity and quality.
One reason for being somewhat skeptical about any claim of radical discontinuity in at least Western conceptions of childhood arises from the fact that, even today the dominant view of children embodies what we might call a broadly "Aristotelian conception" of childhood. According to Aristotle, there are four sorts of causality, one of which is Final causality and another is Formal Causality. Aristotle thinks of the final Cause of a living organism as the function that organism normally performs when it reaches maturity. He thinks of the Formal Cause of the organism as the form or structure it normally has in maturity, where that form or structure is thought to enable the organism to perform its functions well. According to this conception, a human child is an immature specimen of the organism type, human, which, by nature, has the potentiality to develop into a mature specimen with the structure, form, and function of a normal or standard adult.
Many adults today have this broadly Aristotelian conception of childhood without having actually read any of Aristotle. It informs their understanding of their own relationship toward the children around them. Thus they consider the fundamental responsibility that they bear toward their children to be the obligation they have to provide the kind of supportive environment those children need to develop into normal adults, where normal adults are supposed to have the biological and psychological structcures in place to enable them to perform the functions we assume that normal, standard adults can perform.
Two modifications of this Aristotelian conception have been particularly influential in the last century and a half. One is the19th century idea that ontogeny recapitulates phylogeny (Gould, 1977), that is, that the development of an individual recapitulates the history and evolutionary development of the race, or species (Spock, 1968, 229). This idea is prominent in Freud (1950) and in the early writings of Jean Piaget (see, e.g. Piaget, 1933). Piaget, however, sought in his later writings to explain the phenomenon of recapitulation by appeal to general principles of structural change in cognitive development (see, e.g., Piaget, 1968, 27).
The other modification is the idea that development takes places in age-related stages of clearly identifiable structural change. This idea can be traced back to ancient thinkers, for example the Stoics (Turner and Matthews, 1998, 49). Stage theory is to be found in various medieval writers (Shahar, 1990, 21-31) and, in the modern period, most prominently in Jean-Jacqhes Rousseau's highly influential work, Emile (1979). But it is Piaget who first developed a highly sophisticated version of stage theory and made it the dominant paradigm for conceiving childhood in the latter part of the 20th Century. (See, e.g., Piaget, 1971.).
How childhood is conceived is crucial for almost all the philosophically interesting questions about children. It is also crucial for questions about what should be the legal status of children in society, as well as for the study of children in psychology, anthropology, sociology, and many other fields.
Any well-worked out epistemology will provide at least the materials for a theory of cognitive development in childhood. Thus according to Rene Descartes a clear and distinct knowledge of the world can be constructed from resources innate to the human mind (Descartes, 1985, 131). John Locke, by contrast, maintains that the human mind begins as a "white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas." (Locke, 1959, 121) On this view all the "materials of reason and knowledge" come from experience. Lockes denial of the doctrine of innate ideas was, no doubt, directed specifically at Descartes and the Cartesians. But it also implies a rejection of the Platonic doctrine that learning is a recollection of previously known Forms. Few theorists of cognitive development today find either the extreme empiricism of Locke or the strong innatism of Plato or Descartes completely acceptable.
Behaviroism has offered recent theorists of cognitive development a way to be strongly empiricist without appealing to Locke's inner theater of the mind. The behaviorist program was, however, dealt a major setback when Noam Chomsky, in his review (1959) of Skinners Verbal Behavior (1957), argued successfully that no purely behaviorist account of language-learning is possible. Chomskys alternative, a theory of Universal Grammar, which owes some of its inspiration to Plato and Descartes, has made the idea of innate language structures, and perhaps other cognitive structures as well, seem a viable alternative to a more purely empiricst conception of cognitive development.
It is, however, the work of Jean Piaget that has been most influential on the way psychologists, educators, and even philosophers have come to think about the cognitive development of children. Piagets early work, The Childs Conception of the World (1929), makes especially clear how philosophically challenging the work of a developmental psychologist can be. In that work alone Piaget discusses the nature of thinking, the "location": of dreams, what it is to be alive, and the philosophy of language. In other works he discusses space, time, and causality. Although his project is always to lay out identifiable stages in which children come to understand what, say, causality or thinking or whatever is, the intelligibility of his account presupposes that there are satisfactory responses to the philosophical quandaries that topics like causality, thinking, and life raise.
Donaldson (1978) offers a psychological critique of Piaget on cognitive development. A philosophical critique of Piaget's work on cognitive development is to be found in Chapters 3 and 4 of Matthews (1994). Interesting post-Piagetian work in cognitive development includes Cary, 1985, Wellman, 1990, Flavel, 1995, and Subbotsky, 1996.
Among modern philosophers, it is again Rousseau (1979) who devotes the most attention to issues of development. He offers a sequence of five age-related stages through a person must pass to reach moral maturity. He rejects Lockes maxim, Reason with children, on the ground that attempts to reason with a child younger than thirteen years of age is developmentally inappropriate.(Locke, 1971)
It is, however, the cognitive theory of moral development formulated by Piaget in The Moral Judgment of the Child (1965) and then somewht later theory of Lawrence Kohlberg (1981, 1984) that have been most influential on psychologists, educators, and even philosophers. Thus, for example, what John Rawls has to say about children in his classic work, A Theory of Justice (1971) is almost solely derived from Piaget and Kohlberg.
Kohlberg presents a theory according to which morality develops in approximately six stages, though according to his research, few adults actually reach the fifth or sixth stages. The first two stages are "preconventional," the middle two are "conventional," and the last two are "postconventional." Where a given individual is to be placed in this scheme is determined by a test Kohlberg and his associates constructed based upon moral dilemmas.
One of the most influential critiques of the Kohlberg theory is to be found in Carol Gilligans In a Different Voice (1982). Gilligan argues that Kohlbergs rule-oriented conception of morality has an orientation toward justice, which she associates with stereotypically male thinking, whereas women and girls are perhaps more likely to approach moral dilemmas with a "care" orientation. One important issue in moral theory that the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate raises is that of the role and importance of moral feelings in the moral life.
Another line of approach to moral development is to be found in the work of Martin Hoffman (1982). Hoffman describes the development of empathetic feelings and responses in four stages. Hoffman's approach allows one to appreciate the possibility of genuine moral feelings, and so of genuine moral agency, in a very small child. By contrast, Kohlberg's moral-dilemma tests will assign pre-schoolers and even early elementary-school children to a pre-moral level
A philosophically astute and balanced assessment of the Kohlberg-Gilligan debate, with appropriate attention to the work of Martin Hoffman, can be found in Pritchard, 1991. See also Likona, 1976, Kagan and Lamb, 1987, Matthews, 1996, Chapter 5, and Pritchard, 1996.
Today even pets and farm animals have minimal legal protection against abuse. Children enjoy, at least in principle, much more extensive legal protection; and certainly enlightened people have become much more sensitive to the prevalence of child abuse, which they strongly condemn. Nevertheless, there are many respects in which, legally and morally, children are still treated today as the property of their parents. Thus, for example, a court may award the custody of a child whose mother has died to the child's biological father, even though the child has never lived with him but has been taken care of by the mother's life-in partner, whom she loves and regards as her father. In general, the "property" conception of children makes it hard to be sure that children will enjoy the protection against abuse they need, and the love and support they both need and deserve.
John Locke suggested that parents hold their children in custody from God, until their maturity. According to him, all parents are placed
by the Law of Nature, under an obligation to preserve, nourish, and educate the Children they had begotten, not as their own Workmanship, but the Workmanship of their own maker, the Almighty, to who they were to be accountable for them. (Second Treatise of Government, sec. 56)Locke added that the power "that Parents have over their Children, arises from that Duty which is incumbent on them to take care of their Offspring, during the imperfect state of Childhood." (ibid., sec. 58)
The idea that one holds ones children in custody from God might be a very attractive one in a society united by a common theology. But it seems to be of no general use in our own multi-cultural and largely secular society. On the other hand, if, like Plato, we thought of children as the property of the state, then parents could be thought of as having their children in custody for the state. But we are not, most of us, comfortable with that idea either. As it is, we can perhaps do little better than think of the society as having a legal and moral interest in protecting the welfare of its children – an interest that underlies and justifies legal protections against child abuse, as well as welfare measures that do something to promote their health and provide for their education. One might want to add, as I do, that a liberal society also has an interest in validating and protecting certain childrens rights. But how such a claim could be justified goes well beyond the scope of this paper.
Recent contributions to this discussion include Cohen (1980), which takes the position that children should have the same rights as adults even if, lacking the capacities needed to exercise a given right that adults have, they will need to borrow the capacities of others to exercise those rights. In contrast to the Cohen position, Purdy (1992) argues that affording equal rights to children would damage their own interests, as well as those of the society.
A useful introduction to the wide range of philosophical issues that concern children's rights is to be found in Ladd (1996). See also Gross, 1977, Houlgate, 1980, Wringe, 1981, and Archard, 1993.
Another area in which the agency of children is coming to be recognized is the treatment of terminal or life-threatening illness. The classic work, The Private Worlds of Dying Children (Bluebond-Langner, 1980) shows how children in a pediatric oncology in the 1970s, when childhood leukemia was almost always terminal, were told, on paternalistic grounds, as little as possible about their diagnosis and prognosis. The children honored this conspiracy of silence by not questioning their parents or the medical staff, yet they discovered for themselves the general nature of their ailment and the likely course of treatment, as well as what it meant to say that they would likely die. Although, according to Bluebond-Langner, they came progressively to this understanding in identifiable stages, those stages were tracked their own individual experience with the disease and with other children suffering from it, and were largely indipendent of age.
Since the publication of Bluebond-Langners book attitudes among medical professionals to childrens agency in treatment decisions and possible disclosure of their diagnosis and prognosis have changed considerably. This has meant revising pre-conceptions concerning their cognitive and moral capacities, as well as increasing respect for them as persons, rather than merely prospective persons. (See Kopelman and Moskop, 1989.)
According to what we have called the "Aristotelian conception, childhood is an essentially prospective state. Given this, what is good for a child will tend to be understood as something that will contribute to its good in adulthood. Moreover, the goods of childhood will be, on the whole, derivative from the goods of adulthood. Child art seems to be a particularly good counterexample to this result.
Of course one could argue that adults who, as children, were encouraged to produce art, as well as make music and play games, are much more likely to be flourishing adults than those who were not allowed these "outlets." And that may well be true. But the fact that much child art has aesthetic value far beyond any art that might be produced by those same people as adults should make us suspicious of the idea that the goods of childhood are necessarily derivative from their value to the adults those children will become. Thus one should be suspicious of Michael Slotes claim that "just as dreams are discounted except as they affect (the waking portions of)our lives, what happens in childhood principally affectsour view of total lives thourgh the effects that childhood success or failure are supposed to have on mature individuals." (Slote, 1983, 14)
Matthews (1980) presents evidence that young children often make comments, ask questions, and even engage in reasoning that professional philosophers can recognize as philosophical. Here are some of his examples:
TIM (about six years), while busily engaged in licking a pot, asked, "papa, how can we be sure that everything is not a dream?" Somewhat abasked, Tims father said that he didnt know and asked how Tim thought that we could tell? After a few more licks of the pot, Tim answered, "Well, I dont think everything is a dream, casue in a dream people wouldnt go around asking if it was a dream." (23)
URSULA [three years, four months], "I have a pain in my tummy". Mother, "You lie down and go to sleep and your pain will go away". Ursula, "Where will it go?" (17)
SOME QUESTION of fact arose between james and his father, and james said, "I know it is!" His father replied, "But perhaps you might be wrong!" Denis [four years, seven months] then joined in, saying, "But if he knows, he cant be wrong! Thinkings sometimes wrong, but knowings always right!" (27)
IAN (six years) found to his chagrin that the three children of his parents friends monopolized the television; they kept him from watching his favorite program. "Mother," he asked in frustration, "what is it better for three people to be selfish than for one?" (28)
A LITTLE GIRL of nine asked: "Daddy, is there really God?" The father answered that it wasnt very certain, to which the child retorted: "There must be really, because he has a name!" (30)
Michael (seven): "I dont like to [think] about the universe without an end. It gives me a funny feeling in my stomach. If the universe goes on forever, there is no place for God to live, who made it." (34)
These and other anecdotes provide substantial evidence that at least some children quite naturally engage in thinking that is genuinely philosophical. What implications does the conclusion have for the philosophy of childhood? There seem to be important implications for each of the topics discussed above. Consider first what we have been calling the "Aristotelian conception of childhood." Philosophical thinking in children can hardly be seen as primitive or early-stage efforts to develop a capacity that adults normally and standardly have in a mature form. In fact adults have no standard or normal capacity to do philosophy. Moreover, they are much less likely to think philosophical thoughts than are children. In this respect, child philosophy is somewhat like child art. Children often have a freshness, an openness, and a creativity in philosophical thinking, as in painting and drawing, that is missing in most adults.
If children can think philosophically interesting thoughts and engage in philosophically interesting reasoning without special adult or societal encouratement, should they be encouraged to think such thoughts and should their ability to do philosophy well be developed. This issue is addressed, for example, in Lipman, 1993, and in Matthews, 1984 and 1994, and, more generally, in the entry, Philosophy for Children.
Some writers of childrens stories and poems, however, are able to explore philosophical issues in a way that both children and their parents and teachers can enjoy and appreciate. Thus when Frank Baum, in the Wonderful Wizard of Oz, has the Tin Man tell the story of his survival through piece-by-piece replacement, he echoes the traditional story of the Ship of Theseus, whose boards were replaced one at a time.
In Ozma of Oz, one of Baums sequels to the Wonderful Wizard, the heroine, Dorothy, upon encountering a copper man constructed to think and speak, but not live, recalls the Tin Man from the earlier episode: "Once . . . I knew a man made out of tin, who was a woodman named Nick Chopper. But he was alive as we are, cause he was born a real man, and got his tin body a little at a time—first a leg and then a finger and then an ear—for the reason that he had so many accidents with his axe, and cut himself up in a very careless manner." (Baum,1907, 42)
Clearly Baum sees an argument from continuity for the persistence of Nick Chopper that differentiates him from Tiktok, who was constructed to perform cognitive and linguistic functions without living.
For other examples of genuinely philosophical childrens stories and poems see Matthews, 1980, Chapter 5, Matthews, 1988, and Matthews, 1994, Chapter 9.
The subject of childrens literature belongs to the philosophy of childhood, not just because some childrens poems and stories are philosophical, but also because the genre has sometimes been thought to be artistically inauthentic.(Rose, 1984) The worry has been that just because adults who write childrens poems and stories are not writing for their own peer group, but rather for a relatively naive and vulnerable readership, what they write is necessarily exploitative and inauthentic.
Without discussing the fascinating topic of literary and artistic authenticity in general it may be enough to point out in this context that at least one way, though certainly not the only way, for a writer of childrens literature to write authentically is for that writer to address genuinely philosophical issues. It isnt, of course, that writers who do that should be seen as covertly writing philosophical theses. It is rather that, among the things that might be as interesting and significant to the writer as to the child reader or auditor is a philosophical issue that story displays.
First published: September 13, 2002
Content last modified: September 13, 2002