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1. Michael 1985: 79-238; 399-404. The best bibliographical resource on Buridan is by Fabienne Pironet, available at her website (see address under Other Internet Resources below).
2. However, the significance of such details is beginning to be understood more fully by historians through recent prosopographical research. See Courtenay 1999.
3. For a discussion and careful debunking of each of these stories, see Faral 1950: 9-33.
4. Faral 1950: 16.
5. See Zupko, John Buridan: Portrait of a 14th-Century Arts Master, Chapter 10.
6. Faral 1950: 11.
7. There is also a commentary on Aristotle's Politics that has been mistakenly attributed to Buridan, though it is actually the work of Nicholas of Vaudemont, a late 14th-century Parisian Arts Master who was much influenced by Buridan. See Flüeler 1992: vol. 1, 132-68.
8. For discussion of Peter of Spain and the teachings of the Summulae logicales, see Joke Spruyt's article, Peter of Spain (Petrus Hispanus) in this Encyclopedia.
9. By the beginning of the 14th century, arts masters were no longer teaching grammar at the University of Paris. The last arts master to compose a treatise on grammar was Radulphus Brito (d. 1320). What appears to have happened is that the teaching of grammar was gradually taken over by quasi-independent colleges and other schools that grew up on the periphery of the university.
10. See John Trentman, Ockham on Mental, Mind N.S. 79 (1970): 586-90, and Claude Panaccio, Semantics and Mental Language, in The Cambridge Companion to Ockham, ed. Paul Vincent Spade, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999): 53. See also Ockham, Summa logicae I.1-3 (OPh I: 7-14).
11. Summa logicae III.3 (OPh: 46). As Paul Spade puts it, [for Ockham,] self-reference is to be allowed except where it would lead to paradox in short, it is licit except where it is illicit (Ockham on Self-Reference, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 15 (1974): 299).
12. I owe this insight to Joël Biard (1989: 196).
13. For Buridan's treatment of the concept of infinity, see Thijssen 1991. For his conception of points, see Zupko 1993b.
14. For discussion of some 14th-century views on this distinction, see Sten Ebbesen, Is Logic Theoretical or Practical Knowledge?, in Itinéraires d'Albert de Saxe: Paris-Vienne au XIVe siècle, ed. Joël Biard (Paris: Vrin, 1991): 267-283.
15. For discussion, see Paul Vincent Spade, The Semantics of Terms, in The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, ed. Norman Kretzmann, Anthony Kenny, and Jan Pinborg (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982): 192-3, and E. J. Ashworth, Logic, Medieval, in The Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 5, ed. Edward Craig (London: Routledge, 1999): 753-4.
16. Thus, Peter of Spain: Simple supposition is the taking [acceptio] of a common term for the universal thing signified by it (Peter of Spain: Tractatus (called afterwards Summulae logicales), ed. L. M. de Rijk (Assen: van Gorcum, 1972): 81). Early terminist logicians, it should be mentioned, did not all agree about the divisions of supposition. Peter, for example, does not mention material supposition, though William of Sherwood includes it in his Introductiones in logicam, 5.2 (Norman Kretzmann, William of Sherwood's Introduction to Logic, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1966): 107). See also Joke Spruyt, Peter of Spain (Petrus Hispanus) in this Encyclopedia.
17. William of Ockham, Summa logicae I.68; OPh I: 207. For nominalists such as Ockham, personal supposition offers a guide to ontology, since a term can supposit personally only for what exists per se.
18. Notice also that this severs the traditional connection between personal and material supposition as varieties of proper supposition. For Buridan, the only proper supposition is personal supposition; all of the others are strictly speaking improper. Stephen Read has linked Buridan's position on material supposition as improper with the breakthrough doctrinefirst fully realized in the work of Buridan's student, Marsilius of Inghenthat material supposition is possible only if materially suppositing terms are significative, or stand for what they signify. See Read, How is Material Supposition Possible? in Medieval Philosophy and Theology 8 (1999): 18 and S 7.3.4: 522, where Buridan considers Homo est species as an instance of the fallacy of equivocation.
19. The qualification, at least in the first instance, is intended to cover the conventionality of signification beyond these primary acts of imposition, which are in Buridan's view naturally determined. He conveys this idea by saying that such concepts are acquired immediately [statim], i.e., without deliberation: from the singular visual cognition there immediately arises the universal intellectual cognition, and so when we see this man, we immediately think of [a] man (S 4.5.3: 296). Nevertheless, it is clear that even the signification commonly and principally given to the term man could be changed after the fact if everyone agreed to use it in a different way. The case is somewhat more complicated at the conceptual level, since it does not seem open to any individual language-user to change the significance of his/her concepts at will. But even these can be changed indirectly, as a result of the dialectical relationship Buridan takes to hold between concepts and spoken or written languages. Thus, someone who learns from a book that kangaroos are marsupials does not acquire a new concept, but augments or modifies the concept he already has.
20. Not surprisingly, terms in the propositions of logic are said to occur in material supposition, since logic concerns the conventional classification of significant utterances and patterns of reasoning and persuasion. Its objects are the immediate, rather than the ultimate, significates of terms. See S 4.3.2: 257-8.
21. See Paul Vincent Spade, Why Don't Mediaeval Logicians Ever Tell Us What They're Doing? Or, What Is This, A Conspiracy?, available online at www.pvspade.com/Logic.
22. Hughes 1989: 97. See also Simo Knuuttila, Medieval Theories of Modality, in this Encylopedia.
23. See Knuuttila 1991: 487; Lagerlund 2000: 162-4. See also Knuuttila, Modal Logic, in the Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy: 355-7, and Medieval Theories of Modality, in this Encylopedia.
24. See Eileen Sweeney, Literary Forms of Medieval Philosophy, in this Encyclopedia.
25. A typical list of positions can be found, e.g., in the Insolubilia of Thomas Bradwardine, which was written in the 1320s. See Paul Vincent Spade, Insolubles, in this Encyclopedia.
26. Another solution, which concedes that Socrates's proposition is true and false at the same time, is rejected as sacrificing too much. The problem with this theory is that it makes it impossible to give the contradictory of Socrates's proposition, which means that it has no proper coordinates in Aristotelian logical space.
27. This is effectively Thomas Bradwardine's solution to the Liar (see Paul Vincent Spade, Insolubles, in this Encyclopedia). But it was not without precedent. Among the others who defended Buridan's solution would have been Bonaventure, who, in the course of discussing one of Augustine's arguments for the existence of God (Soliloquies I.15) – i.e., that if no truth exists, then some truth exists; and if some truth exists, a First Truth exists – records the objection that the first inference fails because no proposition can entail its own contradictory. Bonaventure agrees, but adds the following qualification: one must understand that an affirmative proposition makes a two-fold assertion, one which asserts the predicate of the subject, and the other which asserts that the proposition is true … Contradiction is concerned with the first type of assertion, not the second. So when it is said that no truth exists [nulla veritas est], this proposition, insofar as it denies the predicate of the subject, does not imply its opposite, which is that some truth exists. But insofar as it asserts itself to be true, it implies that some truth exists [infert aliquam veritatem esse] (Quaestiones disputatae de mysterio Trinitatis, q. 1, a. 1, ad 5; Latin text excerpted in Spade 1975: 53). For other advocates of this solution, see Paul Vincent Spade, Insolubilia in the Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy: 249.
28. Cf. Buridan's earlier claim that contradiction requires not only the logical form of contradiction, but the speaker's intention (S 9.7, 2nd sophism: 943).
29. Pironet 1993: 294-5. Cf. Hughes 1982: 167-9.
30. Buridan's presentation of this alternative is complicated somewhat by the doctrinal claim that the nothing signified by A man is a donkey is not any kind of proposition, but that a man is a donkey [hominem esse asinum], which is the dictum or sentential nominalization of that proposition (expressed in Latin by the accusative + infinitive construction). In Buridanian semantics, such a construction supposits for whatever both the subject and predicate terms of its corresponding proposition supposit for, provided the proposition is true; otherwise it supposits for nothing. Gyula Klima remarks that this is how Buridan manages to assign some credible semantic function to such sentential nominalizations without having to subscribe to a dubious ontology of eternal or quasi-eternal enuntiabilia, or complexe significabilia, distinct from ordinary substances and accidents (Klima 2001: 844, n. 28; for his reaction to those who did seem to subscribe to such an ontology, see section 3 above). Buridan's sensitivity to the ontological dimensions of the problem emerges when he says that that a man is a donkey is nothing, because a man cannot be a donkey [hominem esse asinum nihil est, eo quod homo non potest esse asinus] – which also suffices for its falsity.
31. A further problem has been drawn to my attention by Paul Spade, in his comments on an earlier draft of this article: if every proposition signifies se esse veram, and we're construing the infinitival expression personally, we've got a problem. For it the proposition is false, the infinitival expression has nothing it can signify, so that the proposition really doesn't have any additional signification at all, contrary to the whole point of the theory. If Buridan was aware of this as an additional problem for the first solution, he does not mention it.
32. As Hughes 1982 has suggested, the force of virtually in virtually implies is that the second proposition would be implied by the first only if the first is actually formulated (169). This emerges in a closing comment on the sophism in which Buridan remarks, perfecting this solution, we have to say that every proposition, adding that it exists, implies that it is true (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 970).
33. Of course, this holds only for affirmative propositions. Negative propositions are true if their subject and predicate terms do not stand for the same thing or things.
34. For a helpful overview, see Thijssen 1998: In many official documents and other texts, philosophers and theologians were exhorted not to cross the boundaries of their own fieldsa reference to Proverbs 22:28and not to become theologizing philosophers and philosophizing theologians (2).
35. Aristotle, Metaphysics VI.1.1026a18; XI.7.1064b1.
36. Precedents for reading theology as metaphysics in this contextwhich is somewhat obscured by the fact that the incunabular edition of Buridan's Metaphysics commentary erroneously gives metaphysica totalis for mathematica totalis and metaphysicus for mathematicus in the 23rd and 25th lines of folio 34racan be found in Robert Kilwardby, De Ortu Scientiarum LXVI.655 and Thomas Aquinas, In De trin. V, a. 4, as well as in Albert the Great.
37. Thomas puts this same distinction in terms of the ratio or concept under which the subject is considered: although philosophy considers all existing things according to concepts [rationes] taken from creatures, there must be another science, which considers existing things according to concepts [rationes] taken from the inspiration of the divine light (In I Sent., Prol., q.1, a.1, ad 1; cf. In De trin., q.5, a.1-4).
38. For this reason as well, Buridan never tries to compare the methods of philosophy and theology, let alone to suggest how the former might be subsumed by the latter. He is aware of the possibility of rapprochement between the two sides, if only by its absence from the Parisian scene: it seems to me that this question [about whether it is possible for demonstration to cross disciplinary lines] is difficult first because there has been exceedingly little discussion between the philosophers and the doctors [of theology], and second because it touches on the means of distinguishing the sciences, and it is even more difficult to assign whence, and in what way, the sciences originally received their distinction (QAnPo I.23).
39. See also Gyula Klima's article, Medieval Theories of Universals in this Encyclopedia, especially sections 8-10.
40. Buridan's allusions to Plato on universals are fairly typical: see, e.g., QM VII.15: 50va-vb, and de Rijk 1992. On other topics, however, he is sometimes suspicious about whether a position handed down as Plato's is in fact Plato's. For example, after disposing of an argument introduced on the authority of Plato for the role of separate substances in the generation of living things, he concludes, and so in this way Plato's opinion is destroyed – if he in fact had an opinion of the sort we have ascribed to him (QM VII.9: 47ra). For discussion of Buridan and Plato, see Schönberger 1994: 292-95.
41. For the meaning of 12th-century nominalism, see the special issue of Vivarium (30.1, May 1992) devoted to this topic.
42. See Peter King, John Buridan's Solution to the Problem of Universals in Thijssen and Zupko 2001: 1-27. King argues that Buridan's nominalism has three interrelated aspects: (1) the ontological thesis that there are no non-individual entities in the world; (2) the psychological thesis that some concepts, though metaphysically particular, can represent more than one individual thing; and (3) the semantic thesis that such concepts also function as common names in Mental Language.
43. Cf. QIP 4: 138, ll. 565-566. Buridan's treatment of transcendental terms is similar: the subject of metaphysics is being, that is, the term being (QIP 3: 135, ll. 449-450).
44. Buridan even regards it as conventional that we treat universals as second-intentional names (TDUI: 145-146). Universals are substances in the second mode of substance only, i.e., they are terms in the category of substance (QIP 4: 140, ll. 635-636); likewise, universal is a transcendent name, and such names occur on one level only (TDUI: 147); and as a form, a universal is a second intention (TDUI: 148)
45. Note also that the differences in universal names do not correspond to any real diversity in the things signified by those names, but in the medium through which we arrive at the concepts by which those names are imposed (QIP 11: 173, ll. 1853-1854). The medium is the more common or general concept, e.g., of sensing, from which the common concept of everything sensitive is formed, and names such as animal are imposed (QIP 11: 173, ll. 1847-1850).
46. That the object of knowledge is a complexum, or proposition, rather than an incomplexum, or a term, follows from the fact that we can believe or know only what can be true or false, and only propositions can be true or false.
47. For discussion, see Normore 1985.
48. For discussion, see Maier 1955: 214-15 and Adams 1987: 184-5.
49. See Duhem 1906-13 and Maier 1955. For discussion, see Grant 1977.
50. Thus, for Aristotle, the thrown javelin does not continue to move because of any force inside the javelin (which is, after all, an inanimate object), but because its movement through the air creates a vacuum behind it which the surrounding air rushes in to fill, thereby pushing the javelin forward.
51. We do not know precisely where Buridan got the idea of impetus, but a less sophisticated notion of impressed forced can be found in Avicenna's doctrine of mayl (inclination). In this he was possibly influenced by Philoponus, who was developing the Stoic notion of hormé (impulse). For discussion, see Zupko 1997.
52. We can also see this in his defense of the sufficiency of efficient causality in explanations of natural phenomena, which eventually led to the eclipse of final causality several centuries later. For discussion, see Des Chene 1996: 186-7.
53. It would not be like Buridan to rule out theological considerations completely. Indeed, he sometimes confronts theological issues with what can only be described as intellectual playfulness. Edith Sylla nicely describes his method here: Buridan does not exclude theology from physics, along the lines of Boethius of Dacia, nor does he overwhelm physics with theology, along the lines of today's Creationists. Rather, in a moderate way, Buridan introduces theological truths into the body of Aristotelian physics and then shows, plausibly, that to draw inferences from physics plus theology, it is necessary to add other hypotheses [e.g., to assume a reference frame for extra-cosmic motion, or a time to measure duration before creation]to beg the human intellect (Sylla, Ideo quasi mendicare oportet intellectum humanum: The Role of Theology in John Buridan's Natural Philosophy, in Thijssen and Zupko 2000: 244-5).
54. See Zupko 1999 and Zupko 2001.
55. See Zupko 1993a.
56. For further discussion, see Krieger 1986 and Walsh 1986.
57. See Saarinen 1993: 161-93.
58. The page number is mistakenly given as lxiiii in the Paris 1513 edition.
59. For further discussion, see Zupko 1995 and Fabienne Pironet, The Notion of Non Velle in Buridan's Ethics, in Thijssen and Zupko 2001: 199-219.
60. The earliest association of the example with Buridan appears to be in Spinoza, Ethica II, scholium to Proposition 49.
First published: June 27, 2002
Content last modified: June 27, 2002