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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Robert Boyle


1. See further Brown 1990, who notes Hume's disparagement of the "passion for hypotheses and systems in natural philosophy" as well as d'Alembert's.

2. Boyle Letters 1:131r; reprinted in Birch 1772, I:cxxx. Birch notes, concerning Boyle's interest in alchemy, that he was instrumental in having "a statute made in the fifth year of King Henry IV against the multiplying of gold and silver" repealed. Every "article, or sentence, contained in the said act, and every word, matter, and thing, contained in the said branch or sentence, shall be repealed, annulled, revoked, and for ever made void; any thing in the said act to the contrary in any wise whatsoever notwithstanding." (Birch 1772, I:cxxxii).

3. See An Historical Account of a Degradation of Gold, made by an Anti-Elixir: A strange Chemical Narrative, BW 9:5-17; Birch 1772, IV:371-374. For discussion of this piece see Ihde 1964 and Principe 1998. The Hunter and Davis edition of Boyle's works is now the standard edition, deservedly, but Birch's 1772 edition is still widely available, so I am quoting from Hunter and Davis, but giving page references to both editions.

4. There is no definitive full-scale biography of Boyle. Among the most easily accessible sources are:

  1. Hunter 1994a. This contains an excellent introduction by Hunter, as well as the best transcription of
  2. Boyle's own third person autobiographical "An Account of Philaretus During His Minority" (BP 37:170r-184v, with some misordering), written between Boyle's coming of age in January, 1648, and July of the next year.
  3. Birch's 1744 Life (Thomas Birch, The Life of the Honourable Robert Boyle, in Birch 1772, I: vi-ccxviii) which includes a shortened version of "An Account of Philaretus."
  4. Maddison 1969, which includes an annotated transcription of "An Account of Philaretus …," 2-54.
Recent, important, accounts of shorter stretches of Boyle's life include Hunter 1993; Principe 1994 and 1995; and Shapin 1993.

5. Michael Hunter has pointed out the same suggestion coming from Meric Casaubon: ‘it is not improbable that divers secrets of [chemistry] came to the knowledg of man by the Revelation of Spirits’ (Hunter 1990, 398-9), and Debus notes Pagel generalizing the point: ‘by means of unprejudiced experiment inspired by divine revelation, the adept may attain his end. Thus, knowledge is a divine favour, science and research divine service, the connecting link with divinity. Grace from above meets human aspiration for knowledge from below. Natural research is the search for God.’ (Pagel 1935, 98f, quoted Debus 1965, 21).

6. Such doubts were not less common in the seventeenth century than in any other. See, e.g., Thomas 1973, 6.4, "Scepticism," 198-206.

7. Birch, Life, Birch 1772, I:xxvi; see BW 2:86, Birch 1772, I:355.

8. Boyle to his father, 25 May, 1642; Maddison 1969, 48-9.

9. Glanville, in Sadducismus Triumphatus (Glanville 1689), argued the same point at length. See further, Hunter 1979; Jacob 1974; and Prior 1932.

10. For further details, see Maddison 1969, 61.

11. Gilbert Burnet, A Sermon at the Funeral of the Honourable Robert Boyle, in Hunter 1994a, 55; Shapin 1994, 187.

12. Boyle to John Mallet, 2 Mar. 1641/2: B.M. Add. MS. 32093 (Mallet MSS.), fol. 293, quoted in Underdown 1971, 331.

13. Maddison 1969, 274. Hunter points out that the earliest draft of Boyle's Will mentions only "Atheists and Theists." (Hunter 1994a, lxxxiv, n 76. (Boyle's ‘theists’ are what we would now call Deists.)

14. The "freshly discovered ... receptaculum chyli (receptacle of the chyle, also known as the receptaculum commune and the receptaculum Pecqueti) made by the confluence of the venae lactae" is now more commonly known as the thoracic duct. The beginning of this duct is the cisterna chyli. The first publication of the discovery was made by Jean Pecquet (1624-74) in 1651 in his Experimenta nova anatomica, though he remarked that he made the discovery some years earlier. In the following year Johannes van Horn (1621-70) published the same discovery, having apparently made it independently (Foster 1924, 49). The venae lactae [the "milky" veins] are the vessels that carry the chyle (lymph given a milky look from the absorption of emulsified fats) from the small intestine to the thoracic duct. (Thanks to Andrew Cunningham for this and other information concerning the history of medicine.)

15. Birch 1772, I:liv. Fell was the Dean of Christ Church who was unorthodox enough to be "determined that even the young bloods of the House should work." (Mallet 1924, 2:427, quoted Cranston 1957, 70). Philosophers remember him as the unfortunate intermediary in 1684 when the King determined that Locke, who had behaved "undutifully to the government" should be deprived of his Studentship, but he lives in popular memory as a result of Tom Brown's impromptu rendering of Martial's "Non amo te, Sabidi" (Epigrammata 1.32) as "I do not like thee Doctor Fell" (etc.). For details see Opie and Opie 1951, 169.

16. See further Berman 1988. The various clerical tracts and published sermons are often philosophically unsophisticated but are nonetheless interesting. See, among others, Charnock 1699, Dove 1605, Edwards 1696, and Pelling 1696.

17. This argument, which can be found in Zeno of Citium (Nihil quod animi quodque rationis est expers, id generare ex se potest animantem conpotemque rationis–"Nothing lacking consciousness and reason can produce out of itself beings with consciousness and reason," quoted Cicero, De nat. deor. ii 22.), is barely sketched by Descartes, but it was developed at length later in the century by Cudworth, Locke, Bentley and Clarke. See further MacIntosh 1997.

18. Cuphophron is "A zealous, but Airie-minded, Platonist and Cartesian, or Mechanist"; Philopolis is "The pious and loyall Politician"; Hylobares is "A young, witty, and well-moralized Materialist," who has earlier been converted by the design argument: "The weight of Reason and the vehemence of Philotheus [A zealous and sincere Lover of God and Christ, and of the whole Creation] his Zeal does for the present bear me down into this belief whether I will or no." (More 1668, 28)

19. For Boyle, as for most of his contemporaries, there are laws that are not laws of nature, with the laws of interconnection between body and soul providing, for him, an obvious example. This interconnection also provides a clear example of a state which God constantly preserves: "the very conditions of the Union of the Soul and Body; which being setled at first by God's arbitrary institution, and having nothing in all Nature parallel to them, the manner and Terms of that strange Union is a Riddle to Philosophers, but must needs be clearly known to Him, that alone did Institute it, and, (all the while it lasts) does preserve it." (BW, 10:188-9; Boyle 1772, 5:150. See also BW, 12:380, Boyle 1772, 6:681; BP 9:40; BP 36:46v).

20. These are the muscles (m. flexor digitorum superficialis and m flexor digitorum profundus) which, with their associated tendons move the fingers of the hand. The tendons of m. flexor digitorum superficialis are perforated and are penetrated by the lower tendons. Schupbach 1982 (60-64) provides evidence from a number of sixteenth and seventeenth century texts to show the way in which these tendons were considered "a thing notable and marueilous to behold [which] prudent nature [hath] wrought (Banester 1578, following Columbus 1559)." Paley's early nineteenth century Natural Theology; or evidences of the existence and attributes of the Deity shows an equal enthusiasm: "There is nothing, I believe, in a silk or cotton mill, in the belts, or straps, or ropes, by which motion is communicated from one part of the machine to another, that is more artificial, or more evidently so, than this perforation (quoted Schupbach 1982, 64)." Both Schupbach 1982, 15, and Cunningham 1997, 109, have an impressive 1685 drawing by G. de Lairesse showing the intersection of the tendons. (Thanks to Andrew Cunningham for drawing these works to my attention.)

21. Conjectured–the edge of the page is torn away. Cf. BP 4:67 where Boyle in a column headed "Against Atheism" lists "The Eyes of Hawkes and Fishes and the Temporary parts belonging to the Foetus."

22. Now, Cleanthes, said Philo, with an air of alacrity and triumph, mark the consequences. First, By this method of reasoning, you renounce all claim to infinity in any of the attributes of the Deity. For as the cause ought only to be proportioned to the effect, and the effect, so far as it falls under our cognisance, is not infinite; what pretensions have we, upon your suppositions, to ascribe that attribute to the divine Being? ... Secondly, you have no reason ... for ascribing perfection to the Deity, even in his finite capacity, or for supposing him free from every error, mistake, or incoherence, in his undertakings (Hume, 1779, Part V).

23. Aristotelian principles were held to be necessarily true, though garnered from experience. After noting that "a deductive proposition ... will be demonstrative, if it is true and assumed on the basis of the first principles of its science (Pr An, 24a27-30)," Aristotle tells us that "it is the business of experience to give the principles which belong to each subject. I mean for example that astronomical experience supplies the principles of astronomical science ... . Similarly with any other art or science (Pr An, 46a17-21)." How these necessary truths are to be derived from experience is not completely clear in Aristotle.

24. John Locke, A Discourse of Miracles, (1706, written 1702), in Locke 1823, 9.258; BW 2:452-3; Boyle 1772, 2:298.

25. "God, in these little Creatures, oftentimes draws traces of Omniscience, too delicate to be liable to be ascrib'd to any other Cause. wonder dwells not so much on Natures Clocks (is I may so speak) as on her Watches." (BW 3:223, Boyle 1772, 2:22, a slightly different version is at BP 8:139.) Berman points out (Berman 1988, 7, and 44 n 11) that the concentration on insects is not uncommon, but it is worth noting that many seventeenth century writers emphasized the meanness and contemptibility of insects whereas Boyle genuinely admires the workmanship involved. The virtuoso, he often emphasizes, is, by reason of his expertise, in a better position than the uninformed to see the strength of such design considerations.

26. See, e.g., BP 7:192. Boyle sometimes notices the logical possibility that God might have created matter "incoherent" (e.g., at BW 3:248, Birch 1772, II:38-9), but in general he adopts the position outlined.

27. Boyle makes this point in a number of places. See, e.g., BP, 1:16, 1:18, 2:14; BW 6:194, Birch 1772 I:445; BW 3:259, Birch 1772, II:48; BW 5:353-4, Birch 1772, III:48; BW 11:130, Birch 1772, V:428. The point was generally accepted. Dryden wrote, "No Atoms casually together hurl'd / Could e're produce so beautifull a world." (Dryden 1958, 1:13)

28. Konrad Daspodius, Brevis doctrina de cometis, et cometarus effectibus (Strasbourg, 1578), CIII(3), quoted in Ruby 1986, 356. Leibniz 1685, §6.

29. Earlier Descartes had remarked that the laws of nature simply were the laws of mechanics (les regles des Mechaniques … sont les mesmes que celles de la nature, Discourse V, AT 6:54). Leibniz thought it was a conceptual truth that the universe was lawlike–whatever happened was the law that governed things or, in particular, that thing. However, as noted earlier, he too agreed that, in practice, we should search for intelligible, that is, corpuscular, laws.

30. For further discussion see Sleigh 1990, 158 ff. In the seventeenth century these laws were generally felt to be, from a human point of view at least, the result of arbitrary decisions by God. The view was still common in the mid-eighteenth century when the American Samuel Johnson wrote: "We are, at present, Spirits or Minds connected with gross, tangible Bodies, in such a Manner, that as our Bodies, can perceive and act nothing but by our Minds, so, on the other Hand, our Minds perceive and act by Means of our bodily Organs. Such is the present Law of our Nature, which I conceive to be no other than a meer arbitrary Constitution or Establishment of Him that hath made us to be what we are" (Johnson 1752, §3, 3).

31. Human souls are "imprisoned" by contrast with "the angelical Community … of <Rational & Immortal beings> not clog'd with visible Bodys" (BP 1:66v). See further BW 8:33, Birch 1772, IV:19. In the apparently fragmentary "A Dialogue between the Soul and Body" Boyle's contemporary Andrew Marvell agreed: the soul is "hung up, as ‘twere, in chains / Of nerves, and arteries, and veins," but Marvell nicely allows the body a similar plaint: "O who shall me deliver whole / From bonds of this tyrannic soul?"

32. In an earlier tradition time and the angels, along with the heavens and the earth, were co-created, so that there was never a time when the angels did not exist. See St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, 1a 61.3 c.; 1a 66.4 c; QD de Potentia Dei, 3.18 ad 20.

33. This is stressed in Of the High Veneration Man's Intellect owes to God, Peculiarly for His Wisdom and Power, BW 10:176-7, Birch 1772, V:142.

34. On this issue see MacIntosh 1991, 1992, and 1994.

35. For Boyle, as for his contemporaries, ‘stupid’ in such context meant simply ‘insensible,’ or ‘non-sensory.’

36. R. Descartes, Principles of Philosophy, 3.45, AT 7A:100. For a discussion of the way in which Descartes's counterfactual views came be taken chronologically see Roger 1982.

37. Boyle argues that this is generally true for scientific explanation, not just for explaining the beginning of the universe. Thus, he writes, "every distinct portion of Matter, … [is in] an Innumerable company of other Bodies … all … governed as well by … The Vniversall fabrick of things, as by the Laws of Motion (BW 6:275, Birch 1772, III:298). The philosophical implications of this point are discussed by Michael Polanyi in Polanyi 1958, 328-331. Polanyi makes the Boylean point that "the class of things defined by a common operational principle cannot be even approximately specified in terms of physics and chemistry" (329, Polanyi's emphasis).

38. BW 5:305, Birch 1772, III:15. Cf. Newton: "The matter of all things is one and all the same, which is transmuted into countless forms by the operations of nature." (Newton 1962, 341) and Huygens: "[It is] accepted by almost all modern philosophers that it is only the figure and motion of the corpuscles of which all things are composed that produces all the admirable effects we see in nature" (Huygens to Paul Pellisson, August 15, 1679, Huygens 1888, 8:198).

39. ‘believe a Deity’ = ‘believe in a Deity’. Boyle's usage was standard at the time.

40. Reading "was, and still is," for Birch's and the first edition's "is, and still was."

41. Something is heteroclite if it is unusual or in some way anomalous. Boyle also refers to God as a being that is "heteroclite."

42. BW 10:174, Birch 1772, V:140, reading "not well" for Birch's and the first edition's "well." The possibility that the laws of nature could vary over time receives serious scientific consideration today: see Collins 2001.

43. Already in 1277 Stephen Tempier, Bishop of Paris, had condemned the view that God could not move the Cosmos in a straight line (though doing so would not change its Aristotelian ‘place’). The Aristotelian claim that such movement would leave a vacuum was not relevant, for God can bring about states of affairs that are "impossible according to nature." (See propositions 66 and 17 of the 219 condemned.)

44. See further, BW 9:409-10, Birch 1772, IV:459. "To be convinced that there is never a body without movement," Leibniz suggested, "one need only consult the distinguished Mr Boyle's book attacking absolute rest (Leibniz 1704, 53)," and recently Catherine Wilson has concurred: "For Boyle, intestine motion is occurring always, in solids as well as liquids (Wilson 1995, 52)," but Boyle himself was characteristically more cautious: "since I consider that we are not yet sure, but that though many of the parts of solid Bodies may not be always moveless, yet some others of them may sometimes for a while at least, be at perfect Rest; I shall conclude as I began, and without resolutely denying that there can be any such thing in rerum naturà, as absolute Rest, I shall content my self to say, That ‘tis not either absurd to doubt whether there be or no; nor improbable to think that there is not, since we have not found it in those very Bodies, where with the greatest likelihood it might have been expected." (BW 6:210-11, Birch 1772, I:457.]

45. See, e.g., §§29 and 55 of Leibniz's fifth letter in the Clarke-Leibniz correspondence, Clark 1738, 4:639, 4:651. For suggestions that Boyle did reject absolute space and time see McGuire 1972, 532, and Alexander 1985, 75.

46. Substantial forms are useless for scientific explanations, and they have as well a number of internal difficulties (see, e.g., BW 5:454, Birch 1772, III:117). However, Boyle does not on this account rule out substantial forms altogether: "when ever I shall speake indefinitely of Substantiall forms, I would always be understood to except the Reasonable Soule, that is said to inform the humane Body; which Declaration I here desire may be taken notice of, once for all (BW 5:300, Birch 1772, III:12)."

47. Strictly, Leibniz distinguished between momentum, mv, and mv2, that is, twice the kinetic energy. See Discourse on Metaphysics, §17.

48. In the mid-nineteenth century James Joule demonstrated that, given certain assumptions about the number, size, and random motion of molecules, if we identify the pressure P on the wall of any vessel containing a gas with the force per unit area exerted by the molecules in their collisions with the container, we can then prove

where N is the number of molecules in the container, m0 is the mass of each molecule, 2 is the mean-square speed of the molecules and V is the volume of the container. If we further assume that 2 remains constant when the temperature of the gas remains constant, then this formula expresses Boyle's law, for all the quantities on the right-hand side of the equation are constant.

49. Four important discussions of the issues raised by the Thomistic/Aristotelian account of the soul are Edwards 1979 and 1985, Owens 1974, and Kenny 1993.

50. More 1662, 2:121; BW 12:390, Birch 1772, VI.689 (BP 1.125 has "dare not" for "cannot"); Locke, Essay, 2.19.1. That "the soul never thinks without an image," is De Anima, 431a, 15-17; St Thomas agreed: "In the present state of life in which the soul is united to a passible body, it is impossible for our intellect to understand anything actually, except by turning to phantasms (Summa Theologiae 1:84.7 c)."

Copyright © 2002 by
J.J. MacIntosh

First published: January 15, 2002
Content last modified: January 15, 2002