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Bernard Bosanquet

Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923), British philosopher, political theorist and social reformer, was one of the principal exponents (with F.H. Bradley) of late nineteenth and early twentieth century ‘Absolute Idealism.’


Bernard Bosanquet was born on July 14, 1848 in Rock Hall (near Alnwick), Northumberland, England. He was the youngest of five sons of the Reverend Robert William Bosanquet by the latter's second wife, Caroline (MacDowall). Bernard's eldest brother, Charles, was one of the founders of the Charity Organization Society and its first Secretary. Another brother, Day, was an Admiral in the Royal Navy and served as Governor of South Australia. Yet another, Holford, was elected to the Royal Society and was a fellow of St John's College, Oxford.

Bosanquet studied at Harrow (1862-1867) and at Balliol College, Oxford (1867-1870), where he fell under the influence of idealist ‘German’ philosophy, principally through the work of Edward Caird and T.H. Green. (Green described him as "the most gifted man of his generation.") Bosanquet received first class honors in classical moderations (1868) and literae humaniores (1870) and, upon graduation, was elected to a Fellowship of University College, Oxford, over F.H. Bradley. While at University College, Bosanquet taught the history of logic and the history of moral philosophy; his only published work during this time was a translation of G.F. Schoemann's Athenian Constitutional History.

Upon receipt of a small inheritance in 1881, Bosanquet left Oxford for London, where he became active in adult education and social work through such organizations as the London Ethical Society (founded 1886), the Charity Organisation Society, and the short-lived London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy (1897-1900). During this time he met and married (in 1895) Helen Dendy, an activist in social work and social reform, who was to be a leading figure in the Royal Commission on the Poor Laws (1905-1909).

While in London, Bosanquet was also able to engage in philosophical work, and many of his major publications date from this time. Some of them--such as The Philosophical Theory of the State and Psychology of the Moral Self--were developed from lectures that he gave to adult education groups. He was an early member of the Aristotelian Society, and served as its Vice President (1888) and President (1894-1898).

At the age of 55, Bosanquet briefly returned to professorial life, as Professor of Moral Philosophy at the University of St Andrews in Scotland (1903-1908), but his health was not good and he wished to devote more time to original philosophical writing. He retired to Oxshott, Surrey, where he nevertheless remained active in social work and philosophical circles. In 1911 and 1912, Bosanquet was elected Gifford Lecturer in the University of Edinburgh. The text of these lectures--The Principle of Individuality and Value and The Value and Destiny of the Individual--serve as the most developed statement of his metaphysical views. It is important for a proper understanding of Bosanquet's philosophy that one recognize that the elaboration of his metaphysics came some time after his work in ethics, social work and political philosophy.

The publication of the Gifford lectures incited a good deal of critical reaction to Bosanquet's views, particularly in metaphysics (e.g., on the ‘idealism/materialism’ controversy and on the nature of finite individuality), logic (e.g., concerning the status of propositions and the nature of inference), and ethics. Despite his vigorous participation in such exchanges, present throughout Bosanquet's work is his desire to find common ground among philosophers of various traditions and to show relationships among different schools of thought, rather than to dwell on what separates them.

In spite of the challenges to idealism from both within and outside of the academic world, discussion of Bosanquet's work continued through the early decades of the 20th century. He died in his 75th year in London on February 8, 1923.

At the time of his death, Bosanquet was arguably "the most popular and the most influential of the English idealists" (J.H. Randall). He was the author or editor of more than 20 books and some 150 articles. The breadth of his philosophical interests is obvious from the range of topics treated in his books and essays--logic, aesthetics, epistemology, social and public policy, psychology, metaphysics, ethics and political philosophy. For his contributions to philosophy and to social work, he had been made a Fellow of the British Academy in 1907, and had received honorary degrees from Glasgow, Birmingham, Durham, and St Andrews.

Bosanquet was one of the earliest philosophers in the Anglo-American world to appreciate the work of Edmund Husserl, Benedetto Croce, Giovanni Gentile and Emile Durkheim, and the relation of his thought to that of Ludwig Wittgenstein, G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell is significant, though still largely unexplored. Although F.H. Bradley is today far better known in philosophical circles, in his obituary in the Times, Bosanquet was said to have been "the central figure of British philosophy for an entire generation."

General Background

Bosanquet's philosophical views were in many ways a reaction to 19th century Anglo-American empiricism and materialism (e.g., that of Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill and Alexander Bain), but also to that of contemporary personalistic idealism (e.g. that of Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, James Ward, Hastings Rashdall, W.R. Sorley, and J.M.E. McTaggart) and organicism (e.g. Herbert Spencer). Bosanquet held that the inspiration of many of his ideas could be found in Hegel, Kant, and Rousseau and, ultimately, in classical Greek thought. Indeed, while at the beginning of his philosophical career Bosanquet described Kant and Hegel as "the great masters who ‘sketched the plan’," he said that the most important influence on him was that of Plato. The result was a brand of idealist philosophical thought that combined the Anglo-Saxon penchant for empirical study with a vocabulary and conceptual apparatus borrowed from the continent. Bosanquet is generally considered to be one of the most ‘Hegelian’ of the British Idealists, though the extent to which the term ‘Hegelian’ is appropriate or illuminating in describing his work has been a matter of some recent debate.

More directly, Bosanquet's thought shows a number of similarities to that of T.H. Green, his teacher, and to Bradley, his contemporary. Bosanquet himself acknowledges that these similarities are far from coincidental. He frequently admits his debt to Green's works and, as late as 1920, he wrote that "since the appearance of Ethical Studies... I have recognized [Bradley] as my master; and there is never, I think, any more than a verbal difference or difference of emphasis, between us".

There is, however, at least some hyperbole in such comments. Bosanquet did not follow either Green or Bradley blindly, and there are important differences in his work. While he defended Green's ethical theory and many of Green's conclusions, he addressed a number of issues never dealt with in Green's corpus. Moreover, while it is clear that Bosanquet considered Bradley's work in metaphysics and ethics to have been momentous, this admiration was no doubt influenced by the fact that Bradley's philosophy and method reflected interests and an approach that Bosanquet had arrived at quite independently.

Principal Contributions


Bosanquet's philosophical views on religion were in large part influenced by early nineteenth century biblical studies--initially, mediated through the writings of his Oxford tutors, Edward Caird and Benjamin Jowett.

The work of David Strauss, Ferdinand Baur, and others, at the beginning of the nineteenth century, marked a turn in the scholarly approach to religion and scripture, towards what is now called ‘the scientific study of religion.’ Religious experience, sacred texts, and religious practice were now to be seen as phenomena open to critical investigation and which could--and should--be examined independently of one's religious commitment, and according to the principles of literary and historical analysis. Strauss and his followers challenged the conflation of religious dogmas and creeds with original religious experience, and they were particularly doubtful whether one could recover much knowledge of such experience from ‘events’ recorded in scripture.

By the mid-nineteenth century, this approach to the study of religion had established itself in Britain, particularly in Oxford. Figures such as Jowett and Caird, and others in the Church of England ‘Broad Church movement’ (such as Frederick Temple, Bishop J.W. Colenso, and Thomas Arnold) argued for a more analytical and ‘rational’ approach to understanding religious belief--though they were frequently criticised for this by Church authorities.

The distinction of practice from dogma and experience from creeds was, however, also a feature of the evangelical movement within the Church of England. Bosanquet, like many of his fellow idealists, was raised in an Evangelical household; his later philosophical views, then, can be seen as a continuation, rather than an interruption or contradiction of, his early religious convictions.

Despite his conventional religious upbringing, Bosanquet was not an orthodox Christian. While he did claim that religion was not only central to one's life, but was that which made life worth living, he held that, taken literally or at face value, many particular religious beliefs are either incoherent or false. Bosanquet notes that, in religion, "rationalism, curiosity, metaphor, and deduction from metaphor, operate by way of distortion" (What Religion Is, p. 68), and that, to help one read biblical texts, one must engage in a hermeneutical enterprise, and ‘learn to interpret’ them--though, even here, he doubted whether ‘the sacred books of a Church can ever be understood in their actual meaning.’ Moreover, some religious beliefs do not mean what many take them to mean. Bosanquet argues, for example, that, if we examine the idea of God--who is often described as an ‘infinite individual--we will find that to attribute ‘infinity’ to a being would be inconsistent with "every predicate which we attach to personality." Finally, Bosanquet held that religious belief in general is not about some supernatural being or transcendent realm, entering into our daily lives. It focuses, rather, on what takes place in the world. His analysis of religion and religious belief is, then, ‘immanentist.’

Bosanquet distinguished religious beliefs about particular persons or events from ‘religion’ (or, what was the same thing for him, ‘religious belief as a whole’ or ‘religious consciousness’). Still, he did not see himself as either an agnostic or atheist, or as reducing ‘religion’ to the ‘ethical’. While he states that there is much in Christianity that is no longer intelligible, he insists that religion--in the sense of religious consciousness--is needed for morality, and that an ethics cut off from religion is "without sap or life." Similarly, Bosanquet's opposition to seeing religion or religious belief as a faith in something supernatural does not mean that he denied the existence of the spiritual or held a ‘reductionist’ view of reality. When it comes to human consciousness, he argued, the spiritual--the awareness of the infinite in our world--is at least as much a part of what exists as the material. This ‘infinite’ here is what Bosanquet called the ‘Absolute’.

Human beings are, Bosanquet noted, aware of something infinite that bears directly on their lives, and in his entry on ‘Philosophy of Religion,’ for J.M. Baldwin's Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902), he writes that it is this awareness, and one's commitment to "that set of objects, habits, and convictions, whatever it might prove to be, which [one] would rather die for than abandon, or at least would feel himself excommunicated from humanity if he did abandon" that constitutes what religion is. (While some idealists, such as Pringle-Pattison, seem to have held that such an Absolute is God, Bosanquet did not--though neither does he explicitly reject the existence of God.) Still, religious belief is neither the same as, nor tied essentially to, rituals and practices. Neither does it require adherence or assent to a set of propositions or dogmas--and certainly not to a set of propositions focusing on beings or events in the history of a community of believers. Religious belief is, in short, quite distinct from ‘theism.’

While one finds religious belief and religious consciousness throughout history and throughout the world, Bosanquet rejects the view that all religions are on a par. Religious consciousness has evolved and higher forms of religion--i.e., those which show a unity of the Divine and human nature--are the more ‘true.’ What Bosanquet is ultimately interested in, then, is religion in its highest or most developed form--what Caird called ‘Absolute Religion.’ Though Bosanquet does not develop what, specifically, this means, his Gifford lectures give some hint as to the direction of his thought.

Despite his criticisms of, and challenges to, Christianity, Bosanquet believed that the world had benefitted from Christian civilisation and culture, and that Christianity was a progress over ‘earlier’ stages of religion. Moreover, he not only frequently employs allusions to Christian religious belief and practice to illustrate his general views, but retains elements from Christian doctrine, such as the ideas of the atonement and of justification by faith--though in a highly modified form. The doctrines of the atonement (to which Bosanquet often referred, using the words of Goethe, as ‘dying in order to live’) and of ‘justification by faith’ (which emphasised the presence of religious consciousness in ‘works’) have a practical rather than a theological significance. The former reflected the notion of ‘self-sacrifice,’ involved in the achievement of self-realisation--where one had to ‘die’ to the desires of one's ‘private will’ in order to ‘live’ as a more complete moral agent. And the latter doctrine was a reminder that one's actions could have a moral and spiritual character only so far as they were carried out, out of a set of dominant ideas to which one was committed.

Bosanquet holds that religion is reasonable, and that any rational person would be religious. He insists that religious belief as a whole is not superstition, and that it is true so far as it is an expression of a ‘nisus to totality’ or a ‘move to wholeness.’ Again, since particular religious beliefs purport to be cognitive, they must, at least in principle, be able to be known by believers and non-believers alike. (He is, however, sceptical about the relevance of traditional apologetics.) In both cases, the standard that Bosanquet employs in order to assess truth in religion is the same as that which he uses to assess the truth in general--namely, coherence.

Though Bosanquet's analysis of religious belief reflects an understanding that, broadly speaking, was shared by a number of his fellow idealists, it is significantly different from other late 19th century and early 20th century perspectives, such as those of William Clifford, John Henry Newman, and William James, and can be seen as an alternative to them. Given its immanentist character and insistence on separating religion from dogma and theology, it is close to the view of religion that one finds in recent work by R.B. Braithwaite, R.M. Hare, W. Cantwell Smith, D.Z. Phillips, and Hendrik Hart, and there is some similarity to the contemporary ‘Sea of Faith’ movement, advanced by the Anglican theologian, Don Cupitt. Bosanquet's views, like those of these authors, have been challenged (for example, by C.C.J. Webb, François Houang, and Alan P.F. Sell) for not only being inconsistent with any orthodox theism, but as presenting in its stead a ‘generic religion’ (which, some critics hold, is not religion at all). It is, however, important to recognise that Bosanquet is not advancing a non-cognitivist or fideist view of religion, and that he maintains that both religious beliefs as a whole and particular religious beliefs must meet appropriate ‘rational’ standards.

Social and Political Philosophy

Bosanquet's social and political philosophy is called ‘idealist’ because of his view that social relations and institutions were not ultimately material phenomena, but best understood as existing at the level of human consciousness. Writing largely in reaction to the utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill and to the natural-rights based theory of Herbert Spencer, Bosanquet's views show both a strong influence of Hegel and an important debt to Kant and to the classical Greek thought of Plato and Aristotle. Indeed, Bosanquet often spoke of his political theory as reflecting principles found in ‘classical philosophy,’ and one of his early works was a commentary on Plato's Republic. Nevertheless, his political thought lies clearly within the tradition of liberalism.

The main source for Bosanquet's social and political philosophy is The Philosophical Theory of the State (1899; 4th ed., 1923), though many of his ideas are developed in dozens of articles and essays which he wrote for professional academic journals, for publications of the Charity Organisation Society and for the popular press. Like many of his fellow idealists (notably T.H. Green, D.G. Ritchie, William Wallace, John Watson and, to a lesser degree, F.H. Bradley). Bosanquet's principal concern was to explain the basis of political authority and the state, the place of the citizen in society, and the nature, source and limits of human rights. The political theory that he develops is importantly related to his metaphysics and logic--particularly to such notions as the individual, the general will, ‘the best life’, society, and the state. In order to provide a coherent account of such issues, Bosanquet argued, one must abandon some of the assumptions of the liberal tradition--particularly those that reveal a commitment to ‘individualism’.

Bosanquet saw authority and the state neither as based on individual consent or a social contract, nor as simply institutions where there is a general recognition of a sovereign, but as products of the natural development of human life, and as expressions of what he called the ‘real’ or general will. On Bosanquet's view, the will of the individual is "a mental system" whose parts--"ideas or groups of ideas"--are "connected in various degrees, and more or less subordinated to some dominant ideas which, as a rule, dictate the place and importance of the others" (i.e., of the other ideas that one has). Thus, Bosanquet writes that, "[i]n order to obtain a full statement of what we will, what we want at any moment must at least be corrected and amended by what we want at all other moments." But the process does not stop there. He continues: "this cannot be done without also correcting and amending it so as to harmonise it with what others want, which involves an application of the same process to them." In other words, if we wish to arrive at an accurate statement of what our will is, we must be concerned not only with what we wish at some particular moment, but also with all of the other wants, purposes, associations and feelings that we and others have (or might have) given all of the knowledge available. The result is one's ‘real’ or the ‘general will’.

Bosanquet sees a relation between the ‘real’ or ‘general will’ and the ‘common good.’ He writes that "The General Will seems to be, in the last resort, the ineradicable impulse of an intelligent being to a good extending beyond itself." This ‘good’ is nothing other than "the existence and the perfection of human personality" which he identifies with "the excellence of souls" and the complete realisation of the individual. It is so far as the state reflects the general will and this common good that its authority is legitimate and its action morally justifiable. Bosanquet describes the function of the state, then, as ‘the hindrance of hindrances’ to human development.

The influence of Rousseau and Hegel is clearly evident here. Indeed, Bosanquet saw in Hegel's Philosophy of Right a plausible account of the modern state as an ‘organism’ or whole united around a shared understanding of the good. Moreover, like Hegel, he argued that the state, like all other social ‘institutions,’ was best understood as an ethical idea and as existing at the level of consciousness rather than just material reality. Within nation states, Bosanquet held that the authority of the state is absolute, because social life requires a consistent co-ordination of the activities of individuals and institutions.

Still, although Bosanquet believed that the state was absolute, he did not exclude the possibility of an organized system of international law. The conditions for an effective recognition and enforcement of such a system were, he thought, absent at that moment--though he held out hope that the League of Nations reflected the beginnings of the consciousness of a genuine human community and that it might provide a mechanism by which multinational action could be accomplished.

Because the state can be said to reflect the general will that is also each individual's real will, Bosanquet held (following Rousseau) that sometimes individuals can be required to engage in certain activities for their own good--that is they can be ‘forced to be free.’ Moreover, he maintained that it is in terms of the ‘common good’ that one's ‘station’ or ‘function’ in society is defined, and it is the conscientious carrying out of the duties that are attached to one's ‘station’ that constitutes ethical behaviour. In fact, on Bosanquet's account, it is primarily in light of one's service in the state that a person has the basis for speaking of his or her particular identity. Not surprisingly, then, Bosanquet was frequently challenged by those who claimed that he was anti-democratic and that his philosophical views led to a devaluation of the individual. Such attacks ignore, however, Bosanquet's insistence on liberty as the essence and quality of the human person and his emphasis on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality (which reflects both his own reading of Kant and the influence of Green's Kantianism.) Moreover, while Bosanquet did not hold that there were any a priori restrictions on state action, he held that there were a number of practical conditions that did limit it. For example, while law was seen as necessary to the promotion of the common good, it could not make a person good, and social progress could often be better achieved by volunteer action. (It is just this emphasis that Bosanquet found and defended in the approach to social work of the Charity Organisation Society.)

Although the state and law employ compulsion and restraint, they were considered to be ‘positive’ in that they provided the material conditions for liberty, the functioning of social institutions, and the development of individual moral character. For Bosanquet, then, there was no incompatibility between liberty and the law. Moreover, since individuals are necessarily social beings, their rights were neither absolute and inalienable, but reflected the ‘function’ or ‘positions’ they held in the community. For such rights to have not only moral but legal weight, Bosanquet insisted that they had to be ‘recognized’ by the state in law. Strictly speaking, then, there could be no rights against the state. Nevertheless, Bosanquet acknowledged that, where social institutions were fundamentally corrupt, even though there was no right to rebellion, there could be a duty to resist.

Although Bosanquet is sometimes regarded as a conservative, recent studies have pointed out that he was an active Liberal and, in the 1910s, supported the Labour Party. He insisted on the positive role that the state can have in the promotion of social well being and he was in favour of worker ownership. It is also worth noting that Bosanquet's audience was as much the professional in social work or the politician, as the philosopher. He was well-informed of the political situation in Britain, on the continent, and in the United States. His interests extended to economics and social welfare, and his work in adult education and social work provides a strong empirical dimension to his work. This background provided him with a broad base from which to reply to challenges from many of his critics-- e.g., from philosophers, like Mill and Spencer, and from social reformers, such as Sidney and Beatrice Webb and, the founder of the Salvation Army, General William Booth. Despite charges that Bosanquet's political philosophy is simplistic, inconsistent, or naive, Adam Ulam notes that The Philosophical Theory of the State "has a comprehensiveness and an awareness of conflicting political and philosophical opinions which give it a supreme importance in modern political thought. Bosanquet is both a political theorist and a political analyst."

It has sometimes been suggested that the influences of Kant and Hegel lead to a tension in Bosanquet's political thought. Bosanquet's emphasis on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality clearly reflects both his own reading of Kant and the Kantian influences on Green. Moreover, Bosanquet believed that the ‘best life’ that he describes as the ‘end’ of the individual and of the state alike, approximates what Kant referred to as ‘the kingdom of ends’. Even Bosanquet's justification of the authority of the state can be seen as a reflection of a Kantian imperative that one wills the state as a necessary means to the moral end.

General Assessment

Interest in Bosanquet's work--as with idealism as a whole--waned during the middle decades of the 20th century. Of the idealists, the writings of Bradley and, in political theory, Green, are now much better known. There is no simple explanation of this; many factors seem relevant.

First, some of the work that made Bosanquet's reputation in his time--his popular essays, the books and articles that came out of his university extension courses, and his involvement in social policy--now seems largely dated. For example, several of his essays lack the logical rigor that one finds in material destined for the more specialized audience of academic philosophers. While insightful and wide ranging--and while accessible to a much wider audience than the work of other idealists, such as Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart--Bosanquet's writings lack the sharpness, the density, and, at times, the outrageousness of those of some of his contemporaries.

It has been suggested, as well, that some of the concepts central to Bosanquet's work are not clearly defined, and Bosanquet himself was an indifferent literary stylist. His work often betrays a looseness that one tends to find in texts based on lectures prepared for general audiences or for classes, and even his early work on logic was remarked upon for its "stiffness." But these primarily stylistic concerns may also be a product of refusing to sever the analysis of concepts from the experience which Bosanquet was trying to describe.

There are other reasons that no doubt contributed to the decline of interest in Bosanquet's work. Aside from the general collapse of idealism as a philosophical movement--by the early part of the 20th century, it was seen by many as a philosophical dead- end--and the suspicion of what was regarded by later generations as its obscure vocabulary, Bosanquet's association with the majority report of the Poor Law Reform Commission and his alleged championing of the nation state, led many to see him as a conservative if not reactionary thinker whose contributions to philosophy and politics were outdated almost as soon as they had been published.

In recent years, however, there has been a renewed interest in Bosanquet's work--particularly concerning his philosophical and social thought, which is experiencing a revival in the work of some contemporary liberal theorists. Given the number of studies published during the past twenty years on Hegel, Green and, more recently, Bradley, and given the reevaluation of the significance of the work of British idealism and its place in the history of philosophy, it seems likely that there will be a reconsideration of the contribution of Bosanquet's philosophy as well.

Bosanquet's Works

A Comprehensive Listing:

The most comprehensive list to date of Bosanquet's work is found in Peter P. Nicholson, "A Bibliography of the Writings of Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923)," Idealistic Studies, 8 (1978): 261-280.

Principal Works

The publication of a 20 volume set of The Works of Bernard Bosanquet (edited by William Sweet) is planned by Thoemmes Press (Bristol, U.K.) for 1999. This will include the following principal works:

Select Bibliography

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bradley, Francis Herbert | idealism: British | liberalism

Copyright © 1997, 1998 by
William Sweet

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First published: June 15, 1997
Content last modified: September 20, 1998