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The most striking feature of Autrecourt's academic career is his condemnation in 1347. In almost every history of medieval philosophy, his censure is presented as one of the most important events in fourteenth-century Paris. In the older literature, Autrecourt's views have become linked to allegedly skeptical tendencies in scholastic thought, and have been unduly shadowed by assumptions about their relation to the views of William of Ockham. Over the last two decades, however, it has become apparent that the study of Autrecourt's thought has been wrongly placed in the larger context of the battle against Ockhamism at the University of Paris in the years 1339-1347. Although Autrecourt was no skeptic -- on the contrary, he attacked the "Academics" or ancient Skeptics -- his philosophical stance challenges the prevailing Aristotelian tradition. In particular, Autrecourt rejected some of the main tenets of scholastic metaphysics and epistemology, such as the substance-accident structure of reality and the principle of causality.
As is the case with many medieval thinkers, Autrecourt's biographical details are few. What we know about his intellectual life has to be reconstructed using dates that are attached to the handful of documents in which he is mentioned. One of these is a record from sometime between 1333-36, indicating that he served as prior at the Collège de Sorbonne. Another important document is a papal letter of 1338 in which Benedict XII confers upon him the function of canon at Metz Cathedral, and refers to him as a master of arts and bachelor of theology and civil law. Evidently, however, Autrecourt did not claim his prebendary stipend until after his trial in 1347.
On the basis of such references, Autrecourt's date of birth can be placed sometime between 1295-98. He originated from Autrécourt in the diocese of Verdun, and was probably a student in the arts faculty at Paris, belonging to either the English, or, more likely, the French nation. His master's degree in arts can be dated around 1318-20. While a student, he must have come across such famous masters as John of Jandun, Marsilius of Padua, Thomas Wilton, Walter Burley, Bartholomew of Bruges, or Siger of Courtrai. Since his law degree was in civil rather than canon law, he must have left Paris at some point for a minimum of five years, probably to study at Orléans, Avignon, or Montpellier.
His membership in the Collège de Sorbonne places Autrecourt back in Paris in the 1330s as a student of theology. On November 21, 1340, Pope Benedict XII summoned him from Paris to Avignon to respond to allegations of false teaching. In his letter, the pope refers to Autrecourt as a licentiatus in theology, meaning that Autrecourt had fullfilled the formal requirements for the theology degree, e.g., lecturing on the Bible and the Sentences. But does it also mean that he was a full-fledged master of theology? The question is controversial. In the judgment at his trial, it was stipulated that Autrecourt could only obtain "magisterial honor and degree" after special permission from the Apostolic See, which seems to imply that he was not allowed to progress to inception in theology (the ceremony in which the magisterial honors would be conferred) until the pope decided otherwise. Moreover, there are no records referring to Autrecourt as a master in theology. This suggests that Autrecourt remained a licentiatus in theology when he moved on to Metz to take his position as canon (and later dean) of the cathedral chapter. He died in 1369, on either July 16 or 17.
Autrecourt's time of trial began in 1340 when he was first summoned to appear before the papal court in Avignon and lasted until his conviction in 1346. An extensive, though as yet incomplete, dossier of the judicial process at Avignon has been preserved in the form of an instrumentum publicum (actually, a draft copy thereof), which served as a model for the preparation of the official record of the process. The papal dossier contains copies of a number of records that played a role during earlier stages of Autrecourt's trial, and gives an account (narratio) of the judicial proceedings from the moment Cardinal Curti, the judge, took over the investigation.
The record specifies the charges and summarizes the false teachings of which Autrecourt was accused in the form of four lists, together totalling 66 erroneous propositions or "articles" (articuli). The articles were culled from Autrecourt's writings and oral teachings. On the basis of this record, it would appear that the papal commissions of Pope Clement VI and Cardinal Curti used evidence from earlier proceedings at the University of Paris and Autrecourt's response to this evidence to reach their verdicts. If this scenario is correct, it raises two obvious questions: why was Autrecourt's trial transferred from Paris to Avignon, and how did it begin in the first place? Unfortunately, the surviving historical evidence is insufficient to answer either question.
The commission of prelates and theologians, which under the chairmanship of Cardinal Curti had discussed all of the articles attributed to Autrecourt, came to the conclusion that they contained many false, dangerous, presumptuous, suspect, erroneous, and heretical statements. For this reason, Autrecourt's writings were ordered burned either at Pré-aux-Clercs or Pré-de-Saint-Germain at Paris at an unspecified future date. Moreover, Autrecourt was ordered to publicly recant several of the articles specified in the legal record. These recantations and declarations, which Autrecourt was first required to make at the palace of Cardinal Curti in Avignon, had to be repeated at the University of Paris. Autrecourt's recantation at the papal court took place before May 19, 1346. The exact date is unknown because it was left blank in the draft prepared by the notary Bernard. In addition to the recantation, Autrecourt was declared unworthy to ascend to the magisterial rank in the theological faculty. Anyone in possession of the authority to present or promote Autrecourt to the magisterium of the faculty of theology was thereafter forbidden to do so.
The Parisian part of the sentence was fulfilled the following year. On November, 20, 1347 the regent and non-regent masters of the university met at the Church of Saint-Mathurin, where papal letters and the process "concering certain articles" were read. This material had been brought from Avignon by Autrecourt himself. On November 25, Autrecourt recanted the four confessed articles and the articles from the letter "Ve michi" in the Church of the Dominicans, and publicly declared that the propositions contained in the other two lists were wrong. In addition, he burned these articles and a treatise, most likely the Exigit ordo. The public reading of the instrumentum and the recantation served an important purpose. It not only made the sentence effective, but also informed the scholarly community of Autrecourt's errors and of the punishments set out in the instrumentum, which they would incur if they were to teach the censured errors. Years later, scholars such as John Buridan, Marsilius of Inghen, and André of Neufchâteau (Andreas de Novo Castro) cited the condemned erroneous propositions as the articuli cardinalis (albi).
Autrecourt's oeuvre is not large. There is a correspondence with the Franciscan theologian Bernard of Arezzo, and with a certain master Giles (possibly Giles of Feno), and a treatise that has come to be known as the Exigit ordo. Furthermore, we have a theological question dealing with the intension and remission of forms and the problem of minima and maxima (utrum visio alicuius rei naturalis possit naturali intendi [Could the vision of any natural thing be naturally intensified?]).
Autrecourt wrote nine letters to Bernard of Arezzo, only two of which survive. In addition, there is one letter from master Giles addressed to Autrecourt, along with a brief response by the latter, which, however, breaks off in mid-sentence. The correspondence has been preserved in two manuscript copies from the intellectual milieu of the Collège de Sorbonne. Together the letters form a small dossier, the central item of which is the letter from Master Giles. Apparently, the only reason the two letters to Bernard were copied was because they are mentioned in the letter from Master Giles. The correspondence between Autrecourt and Bernard of Arezzo is much earlier, dating from the time when both were theology students, engaged as opponents in each other's Principia, i.e., inaugural lecture on the Sentences. They can be dated between October 1335 and June 1336, although both Principia are now lost. There is no evidence that Autrecourt ever actually wrote a commentary on the Sentences, which, in any case was not a formal requirement for obtaining a degree. The theme of the discussion in the Principia and the letters to Bernard of Arezzo is the validity of Aristotle's principle of non-contradiction, as presented in Book IV of the Metaphysics.
The Exigit ordo is the fruit of Autrecourt's teaching in the arts faculty. Instead of expounding his views in commentaries on Aristotle's texts, Autrecourt chose to write an independent treatise discussing issues pertaining to natural philosophy, metaphysics, epistemology, philosophical psychology, and ethics, and engaging in debate with unnamed contemporaries. The work was completed in the years 1333-35, at which time Autrecourt was preparing his commentary on the Sentences. For financial reasons, Autrecourt taught in the arts faculty while he was enrolled as a student in theology.
The Exigit ordo is also known as the Tractatus universalis (Universal Treatise). The latter title is actually a misreading of the first two words of the treatise, "tractatus utilis" (useful treatise). It has been preserved in a single manuscript copy, which, like the Giles letter, breaks off in mid-sentence. It is divided into two prologues, two treatises, and several chapters, which, unfortunately, the scribe has placed in the wrong order. The Latin edition and English translation both preserve the order of the medieval manuscript without correction.
The theological question is a report (reportatio) of a theological disputation in which Autrecourt served as respondent to the objections. Although the presiding master of a disputation would usually have to be considered its real author, matters may be different here. Since it is a reportatio -- i.e., a text which, unlike an ordinatio, was not subjected to later editing by the master himself -- Autrecourt's views probably appear in unadulterated form. The question was disputed between 1336-1339, and has been little studied by scholars.
Central to Autrecourt's teaching is the view that all evident knowledge (with the exception of the certitude of faith) must be reducible to the first principle (primum principium), i.e., to the principle of non-contradiction. An inference yields evident knowledge only when the affirmation of its antecedent and the negation of its consquent are contradictory. This means that the antecedent and the consequent, or, more precisely, what is signified by the antecedent and the consequent, must be identical, "because if this were not the case, it would not be immediately evident that the antecedent and the opposite of the consquent cannot stand together without contradiction." It is in the context of this theory that Autrecourt launches an attack on our claim to have certain knowledge of the existence of substances and causal relations. If A and B are two distinct entities, he says, one cannot infer with certainty (knowledge of) the existence of A from that of B or vice versa, for the affirmation of the one and the denial of the other does not result in a contradiction. On the basis of this principle, one may not infer (knowledge of) the existence of effects from knowledge of their causes, nor (knowledge of) the existence of substances from knowledge of their accidents.
This view runs contrary to the Aristotelian position, according to which causal relations really exist and are discoverable by means of induction, so that the existence of substances can be inferred from the perceptible accidents inhering in them. The upshot of Autrecourt's view is that we do not have experience of causal relations or substances, nor does logic provide certain knowledge of them. There are no logical reasons to assume that there is an evident relation between a cause and an effect, or between a substance and an accident.
The position outlined above is developed in Autrecourt's correspondence. It has led historians of philosophy to characterize him as the most important, if not the only, "real" representative of medieval scepticism, as "the medieval Hume", to use Hastings Rashdall's epithet. On closer inspection, however, it turns out that Autrecourt's scepticism is reserved for rationalist claims about the truth of our commitments to causality and substance, concepts for which we have no empirical proof. He is not a sceptic at all when it comes to defending the reliability of sense-perception.
In his Letter to Bernard, Autrecourt takes on Bernard of Arezzo, who had argued that the intellect is neither certain of the existence of those things of which it has a clear intuitive cognition, nor of its own acts. Autrecourt reveals the full implications of this position by pointing out to Bernard that "you are not certain of those things which are outside of you. And so you do not know if you are in the sky or on earth, in fire or in water...Similarly, you do not know what things exist in your immediate surroundings, such as whether you have a head, a beard, hair, and the like." He concludes that Bernard's stance is even worse than that of "the Academics," that is, the ancient Skeptics.
To Bernard's skeptical challenges Autrecourt replies that sense experience is reliable. This theme is not further developed in the letters to Bernard, however. For discussion of this topic we must turn to the Exigit ordo. In one section of this treatise, which is reminiscent of Aristotle's Metaphysics IV, 5, Autrecourt addresses one of the central issues of metaphysics, namely the relation between appearance and reality. He addresses Protagoras' view that whatever is apparent is true: An omne illud quod apparet sit? (Does everything that appears exist?).
Autrecourt defends the thesis that what appears, is, and that what appears true, is true. He finds this view more plausible than its opposite, viz., that the intellect cannot possess certitude. His concept of appearance plays a key role in his doctrine of certain knowledge. It is used in a phenomenological sense, to describe perceptual experiences. According to Autrecourt, the intellect is certain of everything that is evident to it in the final analysis. This is the case for everything that appears in a proper sense (apparet proprie), i.e., that appears clearly in an act of the external senses (in actu sensuum exteriorum). He identifies appearances with the objects of immediate sensory experience, which are considered evident. In this way, he implies that sense perception is a reliable source of truth, i.e., that the apparent properties of an object are its actual properties.
But is sense perception reliable? Perceptual errors and dreams seem to indicate that things are not always as they seem. Autrecourt discusses several sceptical doubts (dubia), versions of what would later be called the "argument from illusion" and the "argument from dreaming". These arguments work from the common sense assumption that things often appear to be other than they are: e.g., sweet food can appear bitter, a white object can appear red, in sleep it can seem to someone that he is flying through the air or fighting the Saracens. How does Autrecourt respond to these sceptical doubts?
By distinguishing between appearance and judgment. Appearances are always veridical: experience cannot be other than it is. However, judgments made from experience can be erroneous, especially if they are based on images rather than on what is perceived "in the full light." In other words, Autrecourt denies any conflict of appearances. Those not "in the full light" are not in themselves misperceptions because the experiences themselves are not illusory. They merely fail to give us the real properties of the object perceived. Potential conflict creeps in at the level of judgment, where ontological claims are made on the basis of appearances. Only those appearances that are "in the full light" reveal the true properties of the perceived object, and only they can provide the basis for true judgments. Appearances of objects that do not come to the perceiver "in the full light" are incomplete or contaminated, as if the observer were looking into a mirror. In other words, Autrecourt carefully distinguishes between x appears F from x is F, for even if x is not really F, it can still appear F and cause someone to believe that it is F. In this way, illusions and dreams turn into mistaken beliefs. Only clear appearances (apparentiae clarae) can cause veridical judgments.
A final topic taken up by Autrecourt in this context is the problem of the criterion: How can one discriminate between appearances that provide the basis for true judgments and those that do not? Like Aristotle, he holds that appearances from what we perceive under "normal" conditions cause true judgments. Also like Aristotle, he asserts that there is no further proof that the criterion on which the distinction between veridical and false judgments rests is correct. Both dismiss worries about the justification of the criterion as absurd. In the words of Autrecourt: "One must accept as true what appears in the full light. Now, concerning the minor premise of this argument, how can you have certainty? ... One way of answering this would be to say that there is no way of proving the conclusion, but that the concept of certitude which is present comes as a certain natural consequence, and not as a conclusion. An example, among others, is that white and black are different. This concept of their difference is not gotten by way of conclusion."
The point of departure for Autrecourt's physics is a thesis which strikes him as more probable than what he finds in Aristotle's Physics, namely that all things are eternal. One of the implications of this thesis is that there is no generation or corruption in the universe, which seems to conflict with the way in which properties begin and cease to exist in their subjects, e.g., when something white turns black, so that the whiteness no longer exists.
According to Autrecourt, no genuine corruption has taken place. It is just that the natural form is no longer visible, since it has been dispersed and divided into its smallest units. In other words, Autrecourt attributes the apparent generation and corruption of things to the motions of atoms. In keeping with this atomistic view, he also holds that space and time consist of indivisible units, viz., points and instants, respectively.
This atomistic explanation of generation and corruption only holds true, he states, if motion is not distinct from the mobile object. For if motion were another distinct thing, it would constitute the generation of something new, whereas rest (the destruction of motion) would constitute its corruption. When seen from this perspective, local motion would refute the eternity of the universe. For this reason, Autrecourt finds it necessary to examine more closely the ontological status of motion.
Autrecourt argues that motion is not a thing distinct from the moving object. Following Ockham, he rejects the idea that motion is a positive thing inhering in the mobile object. Thus, the loss of motion should not be described as the destruction or corruption of an entity, and the eternity doctrine is saved.
Autrecourt did not leave any logical writings, nor does he discuss logic or semantics in the Exigit ordo or in his correspondence. However, from his theological question and a few of the censured articles it is clear that he was familiar with the logical debates of his time. According to one of the articles, Autrecourt claimed that the proposition "Man is an animal" is not necessary according to the faith, because in that sense one does not attend to the necessary connection between its terms. The article should be seen against the background of the sophism "Man is an animal", which received considerable attention in the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. It served to clarify the relation between meaning (significatio) and reference (suppositio) by investigating the verification of propositions concerning empty classes. Would the proposition "Man is an animal" still be true if no man exists?
Five other articles that turn up in Autreourt's condemnation concern the complexe significabile, or what is signified by an entire proposition. According to adherents of the doctrine such as Adam Wodeham and Gregory of Rimini, the object of knowledge is not the proposition, or the things (res) referred to in the external world, but "that which is signified" by the proposition (complexe significabile). One of the problems raised by this theory concerned the ontological status of the complexe significabile: Is it something (aliquid) or nothing (nihil)? Echos of this and other debates can be found in these articles.
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First published: October 14, 2001
Content last modified: October 14, 2001