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An artifact may be defined as an object that has been intentionally made or produced for a certain purpose. Often the word ‘artifact’ is used in a more restricted sense to refer to simple, hand-made objects (for example, tools) which represent a particular culture. (This might be termed the ‘archaeological sense’ of the word.) In experimental science, the expression ‘artifact’ is sometimes used to refer to experimental results which are not manifestations of the natural phenomena under investigation, but are due to the particular experimental arrangement.


Artifacts are contrasted to natural objects; they are products of human actions. Consequently an artifact has necessarily a maker or an author. Using the word ‘author’ in a somewhat generalized sense, we may thus adopt the principle:
(A1) If an object is an artifact, it has an author.
Can (A1) be strengthened to an equivalence? Experimental artifacts are unintended products of the experimenter's plans and actions, but otherwise the word is usually applied only to intended products: not all products of an agent's actions are artifacts. If we restrict the application of the expressions ‘author’ and ‘authorship’ in a similar way, we might strengthen (A1) to
(A2) An object is an artifact if and only if it has an author.
According to (A2), artifact and author are correlative concepts (Hilpinen 1993). It should be observed that (A2) allows the possibility that an artifact has more than one author: such objects may be termed ‘collective artifacts’. (A2) makes the concept of artifact equivalent to that of work (as product as opposed to activity); for example, according to (A2), all works of art, including musical and literary works, should be called ‘artifacts’ insofar as they have authors. In aesthetics, the expression ‘artifact’ has been used in this wide sense when it has been argued, as many philosophers have done, that works of art are necessarily artifacts. In a more restricted sense which is closer to the "archaeological" meaning mentioned above, artifacts are physical objects or in any case inhabitants of the physical, spatio-temporal world. If we say that an author can create a work only by making some artifact (e.g., to write a novel, one has to produce a manuscript), the expression ‘artifact’ is used in this narrow (or primary) sense.

An object which is an artifact in this primary sense is usually made from some pre-existing object or objects by successive intentional modifications; this activity is called work. This feature of artifacts is reflected in the definition of an artifact as an object "showing human workmanship or modification".

When a person intends to make an object, his productive intention has as its content some description of the intended object; the agent intends to make an object of a certain kind. An author's intention "ties" to an artifact a number of predicates which determine the intended character of the object. The existence and some of the properties of the artifact are dependent on its intended character. This is expressed by the following Dependence Condition:

(DEP) The existence and some of the properties of an artifact depend on an agent's (or author's) intention to make an object of certain kind.
The causal tie between an artifact and its intended character -- or, strictly speaking, between an artifact and the author's productive intention -- is mediated by the author's actions, that is, by his work on the object. The actual properties of an artifact constitute its actual character. The success of the author's productive activity depends on the degree of fit or agreement between the intended and the actual character of the object. The actual character of an artifact is of course always much richer than the intended character; the artifact fits the author's intentions if and only if the former includes the latter. At least one of the descriptions included in the intended character must be a sortal predicate which determines the identity of the object and the criteria by which it can be distinguished from other objects. For example, ‘painting’ and ‘chair’ are sortal descriptions, but ‘red thing’ is not: it is possible to give a definite answer to the question of how many chairs there are in a given room, but not to the question of how many red things there are in the room.

The Evaluation of Artifacts

Often an artifact is identified by a sortal description which refers to its intended function (e.g., ‘hammer’). But this need not always be the case: for example, ‘painting’ is an artifact sortal which is not derived from the purpose or function of the object, but from the way in which it has been produced. An object that has been made for a purpose F may be termed ‘an F-object’. The properties of an F-object can be divided into two classes: (i) those relevant to the functioning of the object as an F-object, and (ii) the properties irrelevant to the purpose F. The former properties may be termed the significant properties of the object (or its F-significant properties); they may also be called the "good-making properties" of the object. For example, the weight of a hammer is one of its significant features, but its color is not. In addition to an identifying (sortal) description F, the content of an author's productive intention includes the properties that he regards as significant for the purpose F. The latter properties depend on this purpose (or purposes); thus the intended character of an artifact is not simply a collection of predicates, but has a hierarchical structure. In many cases an object is expected to serve many different purposes; thus the description F may be quite complex.

An author's productive activity may be evaluated on the basis of the relationships among the intended character of an artifact, its actual character, and a purpose F:

(E1) The degree of fit or agreement between the intended character and the actual character of an object,

(E2) The degree of fit between the intended character of an object and the purpose F, in other words, the suitability of an object of the intended kind for the purpose F,

(E3) The degree of fit between the actual character of an object and the purpose F, that is, the suitability of an artifact for F.
(E1) determines whether an artifact is a successful embodiment of the author's intentions, (E2) determines whether the character that the author intends to give to an artifact is suitable for the purpose F, and (E3) tells whether the author has succeeded in making an object that is in fact suitable for the purpose F. The study of artifacts (as artifacts) is intrinsically evaluative, since viewing an object as an artifact means viewing it in the light of intentions and purposes.

The purpose F on which the evaluation of an artifact and its design is based need not be the purpose that the author had in mind; it can be any purpose for which the artifact might be used. The direction of evaluation may be reversed so that the maker or owner of an artifact tries to find new uses for it. In addition, we should distinguish the actual character of an artifact from the author's conception of it. If the author's conception of an object agrees with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively satisfactory for the author, but it may fail to fit the author's productive intentions if he has a mistaken conception of it.

If the author's productive activity is successful, the character of a completed artifact both depends on and agrees with his productive intentions so that it can be regarded as an embodiment of these intentions.If the actual character of an object does not agree with its intended character, it is unsatisfactory from the author's point of view, and if the author's conception of an object does not agree with its intended character, the artifact is subjectively unsatisfactory from the author's point of view. In the latter case the author has a reason to try to improve the object until it satisfies his productive intentions. A change in an object which improves the fit between its actual and intended character is, from the standpoint of the author's intentions, a progressive change.

It seems plausible to regard an object as a proper artifact only if its maker's productive activity has some degree of success, for example, satisfies some sortal predicate included in his productive intention. This condition may be termed the Success Condition:

(SUC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if it satisfies some sortal description included in the author's productive intention.
If an agent's activity fails in every respect, the agent does not accomplish anything, but produces only "scrap". But even if the object does not fit the author's productive intention, but he accepts it as a satisfactory realization of his intention, it may be regarded as a proper artifact; this is expressed by the following Acceptance Condition:
(ACC) An object is an artifact made by an author only if the author accepts it as satisfying some sortal description included in his productive intention.
If an artifact has several authors, the Acceptance Condition should hold for at least one of them. According to the Acceptance Condition, an object is an artifact only if its maker regards it as such, that is, accepts it as a product of his intentional activity. The Success Condition concerns the fit between the actual and the intended character of an object; the Acceptance Condition the fit between the author's conception of an object and its intended character. In this context it should be observed that the author's intention may change during his productive activity. In the above conditions, ‘productive intention’ should be regarded as referring to the content of the author's "final" intentions concerning the artifact.

The conditions listed above provide a partial characterization of the concept of artifact. We might say that different intentionally modified objects exhibit different degrees of artifactuality, depending on how well they satisfy these conditions.

Randall Dipert's (1993) theory of artifacts includes the condition that an artifact (in the strict sense) should be intended by its author to be recognized as having been intentionally modified for a certain purpose. This is a plausible condition, since an F-object can presumably be a good F-object only if its potential users recognize it as such. However, this recognizability should not be taken to mean general recognizability: a mechanical shark used in making an adventure film is an artifact, but its authors do not wish the audience to recognize it as such, on the contrary; the condition of recognizability concerns only the persons who are using it in the making of the film.

Works of Art

As was mentioned above, artifactuality is often regarded as a defining characteristic of works of art (Stephen Davies 1991); for example, this is an essential condition in George Dickie's (1984) analysis, according to which a work of art is an "artifact of a kind created to be presented to an Artworld public". The condition of artifactuality is plausible only if the concept of artifact is understood in a wide sense in which intentionally created events and processes (e.g., performances) and works which have instances (for example, musical and literary works) can be regarded as artifacts. According to condition (A2), the condition of artifactuality in this sense is equivalent to the requirement that a work of art should have an author. Some philosophers of art have rejected the condition of artifactuality, using instances of "driftwood art" and analogous examples as counterexamples. According to condition (A2), this view has the seemingly paradoxical consequence that a work of art need not be a product of anyone's work and need not have an author. Other philosophers have responded to such examples by extending the concept of artifactuality in such a way that the presentation of a natural object as an object of aesthetic appreciation counts as an "intentional modification" required for artifactuality. If the expression ‘artifact’ is used in a sufficiently wide sense, the condition of artifactuality clearly holds for artworks, but it is equally obvious that not all works of art (or works in general) are artifacts in the narrow sense of the word. In aesthetic evaluation and criticism, however, they are treated as if they were artifacts.


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Copyright © 1999 by
Risto Hilpinen

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First published: January 5, 1999
Content last modified: January 5, 1999