This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Aristotle's Rhetoric

The topoi of the Rhetoric

Interpreters are faced with the problem that the use of the word ‘topos’ in Aristotle's Rhetoric is much more heterogeneous than in the Topics. Beside topoi which do perfectly comply with the description given in the Topics, there is an important group of topoi in the Rhetoric which contain instructions for arguments not of a certain form, but with a certain predicate (for example, that something is good, or honorable, or just, or contributes to happiness etc.). While those material topoi are still used to build arguments, there are also uses of ‘topos’ in the context of the non-argumentative means of persuasion.

In I.2, 1358a2-35 Aristotle distinguishes between general/common topoi on the one hand and specific topoi on the other hand. In chapter I.2 he explains the sense of ‘specific’ by pointing out that some things are specific to physics, others to ethics, etc. But from chapter I.3 on he makes us think that ‘specific’ refers to the different species of rhetoric, so that some topoi are specific to deliberative, other to epideictic, and still others to juridical speech. While he is inclined to call the general or common topoi simply ‘topoi’, he uses several names for the specific topoi (idiai protaseis, eidê, idioi topoi). Roughly, it is clear that the specific topoi can be found in the first and the common topoi in the second book of the Rhetoric. Most interpreters assumed that all common topoi are listed in chapters II.23-24 (for real enthymemes in II.23, for fallacious enthymemes in II.24), but failed to notice that more common topoi can be found in II.19. Further, it may be tempting to call, as some do, the specific topoi ‘material’ and the common topoi ‘formal’; but in so doing interpreters often neglected that some of the common topoi in chapters II.23-24 are not all based on those formal categories on which the topoi of the Topics rely. Most of them are ‘common’ only in the sense that they are not specific to one single species of speech. Some of them only offer strategic advice, as, for example, to turn what has been said against oneself upon the one who said it. For this reason, it is completely misleading to say that the functions of specific and common topoi are complementary, insofar as the common topoi allegedly offer the logical form to a content that has been provided by the specific ones.

The specific topoi of the Rhetoric

Since Aristotle sometimes calls the specific topoiprotaseis’, and ‘protasis’ is at the same time the Greek word for ‘premise’ and ‘statement, sentence’, his treatment of specific topoi gave rise to serious confusions. Several authors subscribed to the view of Friedrich Solmsen that there are two types of enthymemes, insofar as some are taken from topoi and some are built from premises, not from topoi. According to this view the specific topoi given in the first book of the Rhetoric are the premises of the latter type of enthymemes ,and the enthymemes of the former type are taken only from common topoi. From this point of view only common topoi would be topoi in the proper sense, while specific topoi would be, strictly speaking, nothing else but premises. Accordingly, one would expect to find sentences of the form “All F are just/noble/good” in the first book of the Rhetoric; with such sentences one could construe syllogisms like “All F are just/noble/good—This particular x is F—This particular x is just/noble/good.” But what we actually find in the first book hardly fits Solmsen's model. In some sense we find more than the required premises, insofar as Aristotle not only gives us isolated sentences, but also certain sentences together with a reason or a justification. Further Solmsen can hardly make sense of the fact that Aristotle calls these alleged premises ‘topoi’. And above all, chapters I.6-7 of the Rhetoric offer topoi which can also be found in the third book of Topics; in the Topics they are clearly called ‘topoi’, so that there is no reason to assume that they are premises rather than topoi.

The general idea by which the specific topoi can be characterized is rather this: Every specific topos gives us a general (but not formal) description of things that are supposed to be good, noble, just etc. It also gives us a reason with which we are enabled to argue that the things described are good, noble, just etc. Typically, this reason refers the given description back to a generally held definition of what is good, noble, just etc., which is provided at the outset the several chapters. In some cases the reason is directly, in some cases it is indirectly linked with the initial definition. Example: The specific topos is: “what is pleasant is good, since it is desirable.” The phrase “what is pleasant” provides the general description, the phrase “since it is desirable” provides the reason. Now, at the beginning of the chapter the good has been defined as “what is desirable.” Another specific topos is “honor is good, since it is pleasant”; here the reason in question applies the previous topos that what is pleasant is good, so that the current topos is indirectly linked with the initial definition of what is good. The general description included in those topoi enables us to identify cases which the orator can present as good, noble, just etc., the added reason shows us how to argue for the goodness etc. of the selected things. Thus, the specific topoi do not only provide premises but complete argumentative patterns.

Several types of rhetorical topoi

The several topoi that can be found under the headings ‘specific’ and ‘common’ do not at all make up two homogeneous classes. Some of them have only a vague affinity to the standard form of topoi which prevails in the book Topics. Some so-called topoi of the Rhetoric neither belong to the specific nor to the common class, but are just instructions or patterns which are somehow useful in public speech. At least the following groups must be distinguished:

  Place Description Examples
(i) I.5-14
(without I.6b—I.7)
specific topoi of the three species of speech “Further, health, beauty, and the like are goods, for being bodily excellences and productive of many other good things.” “It is noble to avenge oneself on one's enemies and not to come to terms with them; for requital is just, and the just is noble.”
(ii) I.6b topoi on controversial goods “That which most people seek after, and which is obviously an object of contention, is also a good; for, as has been shown, that is good which is sought after by everybody, and ‘most people’ is taken to be equivalent to ‘everybody’.”
(iii) I.7 topoi on the greater good (the better) “Again, where one good is always accompanied by another, but does not always accompany it, it is greater than the other, for the use of the second thing is implied in the use of the first.”
(iv) I.15 topoi of non-technical means of persuasion “We shall argue that justice indeed is true and profitable, but that sham justice is not, and that consequently the written law is not, because it does not fulfill the true purpose of law.”
(v) II.2-11, II.12-17 topoi to arouse emotions “Again we are angry if something is not in line with what we expected, since what is not in line with what we expect provides more pain.”
(vi) II.19 topoi about the possible, the past, the future “If the beginning of a thing can occur, so can the end; for nothing impossible occurs or begins to occur.”
(vii) II.23-24 common topoi
(type 1)
“If a quality does not in fact exist where it is more likely to exist, it clearly does not exist where it is less likely.”
(viii) II.23-24 common topoi
(type 2)
“Another line of argument is common to forensic and deliberative oratory, namely, to consider inducements and deterrents, and the motives people have for doing or avoiding the actions in question.”
(ix) II.23-24 common topoi
(type 3)
“Another line is to apply to the other speaker what he has said against yourself.”
(x) III.15 topoi for slandering “Another method is to denounce calumny, by saying what an enormity it is, and in particular that it raises false issues, and that it means a lack of confidence in the merits of his case.”

Typical examples of group (i) can be found in chapters I.5-6 (first half), 9 and others. Starting form a definition of what is happiness, good, honorableand just etc., those topoi instruct arguments to the effect that items of a certain type are part of happiness, are good, honorable, just etc. The groups (ii) und (iii) have been inserted to indicate that the so-called specific topoi include various kinds of instructions: while the topoi of the first group offer determinate premises from which one can deduce that items of a certain type are good, just etc., the topoi of groups (ii) to (iii) help to construe diverse premises for items of several kinds. The topoi of group (iv) tell the orator what to say if one is using non-technical (i.e. artless) means of persuasion such as contracts, laws, witnesses etc. Just as the topoi of group (x), which offers the orators formulas for slandering, the underlying concept of topos in this group is essentially the same as in the pre-Aristotelian usage. The items mentioned in group (v) by which the orator should be enabled to arouse certain emotions in different contexts are also called ‘topoi’, though they do not contribute to argumentation in the strictest sense. With respect to their formal character the topoi of group (vi) are quite familiar to the topoi of the Topics. The topoi of groups (vii) to (ix) are common insofar as they are not connected with a certain species of rhetoric. But while the topoi of group (vii) are roughly of the same type as the topoi of the Topics, other so-called ‘common’ topoi are exclusively suited for rhetorical purposes; the topoi of group (ix) only offer strategic advices.

Copyright © 2002 by
Christof Rapp

Return to Aristotle's Rhetoric

First published: May 2, 2002
Content last modified: May 2, 2002