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In Nicomachean Ethics I.2 Aristotle characterizes politics as the most authoritative science. It prescribes which sciences are to be studied in the city-state, and the other capacities -- such as military science, household management, and rhetoric -- fall under its authority. Since it governs the other practical sciences, their ends serve as means to its end, which is nothing less than the human good. "Even if the end is the same for an individual and for a city-state, that of the city-state seems at any rate greater and more complete to attain and preserve. For although it is worthy to attain it for only an individual, it is nobler and more divine to do so for a nation or city-state." (EN I.2.1094b7-10) Aristotle's political science encompasses the two fields which modern philosophers distinguish as ethics and political philosophy. (See the entry on Aristotle's ethics.) Political philosophy in the narrow sense is roughly speaking the subject of his treatise called the Politics. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:
Supplement: Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle's Politics
Aristotle frequently compares the politician to a craftsman. The analogy is imprecise because politics, in the strict sense of legislative science, is a form of practical wisdom or prudence, but valid to the extent that the politician produces, operates, and maintains a legal system according to universal principles (EN VI.8 and X.9). In order to appreciate this analogy it is helpful to observe that Aristotle explains production of an artifact in terms of four causes: the material, formal, efficient, and final causes (Phys. II.3 and Met. A.2). For example, clay (material cause) is molded into a vase shape (formal cause) by a potter (efficient or moving cause) so that it can contain liquid (final cause). (For discussion of the four causes see the entry on Aristotle's physics.)
One can also explain the existence of the city-state in terms of the four causes. It is a kind of community (koinônia), that is, a collection of parts having some functions and interests in common (Pol. II.1.1261a18, III.1.1275b20). Hence, it is made up of parts, which Aristotle describes in various ways in different contexts: as households, or economic classes (e.g., the rich and the poor), or demes (i.e., local political units). But, ultimately, the city-state is composed of individual citizens (see III.1.1274a38-41), who, along with natural resources, are the "material" or "equipment" out of which the city-state is fashioned (see VII.14.1325b38-41).
The formal cause of the city-state is its constitution (politeia). Aristotle defines the constitution as "a certain ordering of the inhabitants of the city-state" (III.1.1274b32-41). He also speaks of the constitution of a community as "the form of the compound" and argues that whether the community is the same over time depends on whether it has the same constitution (III.3.1276b1-11). The constitution is not a written document, but an immanent organizing principle, analogous to the soul of an organism. Hence, the constitution is also "the way of life" of the citizens (IV.11.1295a40-b1, VII.8.1328b1-2). Here the citizens are that minority of the resident population who are adults with full political rights.
The existence of the city-state also requires an efficient cause, namely, its ruler. On Aristotle's view, a community of any sort can possess order only if it has a ruling element or authority. This ruling principle is defined by the constitution, which sets criteria for political offices, particularly the sovereign office (III.6.1278b8-10; cf. IV.1.1289a15-18). However, on a deeper level, there must be an efficient cause to explain why a city-state acquires its constitution in the first place. Aristotle states that "the person who first established [the city-state] is the cause of very great benefits" (I.2.1253a30-1). This person was evidently the lawgiver (nomothetês), someone like Solon of Athens or Lycurgus of Sparta, who founded the constitution. Aristotle compares the lawgiver, or the politician more generally, to a craftsman (dêmiourgos) like a weaver or shipbuilder, who fashions material into a finished product (II.12.1273b32-3, VII.4.1325b40-1365a5).
The notion of final cause dominates Aristotle's Politics from the opening lines:
Since we see that every city-state is a sort of community and that every community is established for the sake of some good (for everyone does everything for the sake of what they believe to be good), it is clear that every community aims at some good, and the community which has the most authority of all and includes all the others aims highest, that is, at the good with the most authority. This is what is called the city-state or political community. [I.1.1252a1-7]Soon after, he states that the city-state comes into being for the sake of life but exists for the sake of the good life (2.1252b29-30). The theme that the good life or happiness is the proper end of the city-state recurs throughout the Politics (III.6.1278b17-24, 9.1280b39; VII.2.1325a7-10).
To sum up, the city-state is a hylomorphic (i.e., matter-form) compound of a particular population (i.e., citizen-body) in a given territory (material cause) and a constitution (formal cause). The constitution itself is fashioned by the lawgiver and is governed by politicians, who are like craftsmen (efficient cause), and the constitution defines the aim of the city-state (final cause, IV.1.1289a17-18). For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:
Supplement: Presuppositions of Aristotle's PoliticsIt is in these terms that Aristotle understands the fundamental normative problem of politics: What constitutional form should the lawgiver and politician establish and preserve in what material for the sake of what end?
Aristotle defines the constitution as a way of organizing the offices of the city-state, particularly the sovereign office (III.6.1278b8-10; cf. IV.1.1289a15-18). The constitution thus defines the governing body, which takes different forms: for example, in a democracy it is the people, and in an oligarchy it is a select few (the wealthy or well born). Before attempting to distinguish and evaluate various constitutions Aristotle considers two questions. First, why does a city-state come into being? He recalls the thesis, defended in Politics I.2, that human beings are by nature political animals, who naturally want to live together. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:
Supplement: Political NaturalismHe then adds that "the common advantage also brings them together insofar as they each attain the noble life. This is above all the end for all both in common and separately." (III.6.1278b19-24) Second, what are the different forms of rule by which one individual or group can rule over another? Aristotle distinguishes several types. He first considers despotic rule, which is exemplified in the master-slave relationship. Aristotle thinks that this form of rule is justified in the case of natural slaves who (he asserts without evidence) lack a deliberative faculty and thus need a natural master to direct them (I.13.1260a12; slavery is defended at length in Politics I.4-8). Although a natural slave allegedly benefits from having a master, despotic rule is still primarily for the sake of the master and only incidentally for the slave (III.6.1278b32-7). (Aristotle provides no argument for this: if some persons are congenitally incapable of self-governance, why should they not be ruled primarily for their own sakes?) He next considers paternal and marital rule, which he also views as defensible: "the male is by nature more capable of leadership than the female, unless he is constituted in some way contrary to nature, and the elder and perfect [is by nature more capable of leadership] than the younger and imperfect." (I.12.1259a39-b4) Aristotle is persuasive when he argues that children need adult supervision because their rationality is "imperfect" (ateles) or immature. But he also alleges (without substantiation) that, although women have a deliberative faculty, it is "without authority" (akuron), so that females require male leadership (I.13.1260a13-14). (Aristotle's arguments about slaves and women appear so weak that some commentators take them to be ironic. However, what is obvious to a modern reader need not have been so to an ancient Greek, so that it is not necessary to suppose that Aristotle's discussion is ironic.) It is noteworthy, however, that paternal and marital rule are properly practiced for the sake of the ruled (for the sake of the child and of the wife respectively), just as arts like medicine or gymnastics are practiced for the sake of the patient (III.6.1278b37-1279a1). In this respect they resemble political rule, which involves equal and similar citizens taking turns in ruling for one another's advantage (1279a8-13). This sets the stage for the fundamental claim of Aristotle's constitutional theory: "constitutions which aim at the common advantage are correct and just without qualification, whereas those which aim only at the advantage of the rulers are deviant and unjust, because they involve despotic rule which is inappropriate for a community of free persons" (1279a17-21).
The distinction between correct and deviant constitutions is combined with the observation that the government may consist of one person, a few, or a multitude. Hence, there are six possible constitutional forms (Politics I.7):
Correct Deviant One Ruler Kingship Tyranny Few Rulers Aristocracy Oligarchy Many Rulers Polity Democracy
This six-fold classification (which is adapted from Plato's Statesman) sets the stage for Aristotle's inquiry into the best constitution, although it is modified in various ways throughout the Politics. For example, he observes that the dominant class in oligarchy (literally rule of the oligoi, i.e., few) is typically the wealthy, whereas in democracy (literally rule of the dêmos, i.e., people) it is the poor, so that these economic classes should be included in the definition of these forms (see Politics III.8, IV.4, and VI.2 for alternative accounts). Also, polity is later characterized as a kind of "mixed" constitution typified by rule of the "middle" group of citizens, a moderately wealthy class between the rich and poor (Politics IV.11).
Aristotle turns to arguments for and against the different constitutions, which he views as different applications of the principle of distributive justice (III.9.1280a7-22). Everyone agrees, he says, that justice involves treating equal persons equally, and treating unequal persons unequally, but they do not agree on the standard by which individuals are deemed to be equally (or unequally) meritorious or deserving. He assumes his own analysis of distributive justice set forth in Nicomachean Ethics V.3: Justice requires that benefits be distributed to individuals in proportion to their merit or desert. The oligarchs mistakenly think that those who are superior in wealth should also have superior political rights, whereas the democrats hold that those who are equal in free birth should also have equal political rights. Both of these conceptions of political justice are mistaken in Aristotle's view, because they assume a false conception of the ultimate end of the city-state. The city-state is neither a business association to maximize wealth (as the oligarchs suppose) nor an agency to promote liberty and equality (as the democrats maintain). Instead, Aristotle argues, "the good life is the end of the city-state," that is, a life consisting of noble actions (1280b39-1281a4). Hence, the correct conception of justice is aristocratic, assigning political rights to those who make a full contribution to the political community, that is, to those with virtue as well as property and freedom (1281a4-8). This is what Aristotle understands by an "aristocratic" constitution: literally, the rule of the aristoi, i.e., best persons. Aristotle explores the implications of this argument in the remainder of Politics III, considering the rival claims of the rule of law and the rule of a supremely virtuous individual. Here absolute kingship is a limiting case of aristocracy. Again, in books VII-VIII, Aristotle describes the ideal constitution in which the citizens are fully virtuous.
Hence, Aristotelian political science is not confined to the ideal system, but also investigates the second-best constitution, the one which is the best that most city-states are capable of supporting. For it is the closest approximation to full political justice which the lawgiver can attain under the circumstances. Although Aristotle's political views were influenced by his teacher Plato, he is very critical of the ideal city-state set forth in Plato's Republic on the grounds that it overvalues political unity, it embraces a system of communism that is impractical and inimical to human nature, and it neglects the happiness of the individual citizens (Politics II.1-5). In contrast, in Aristotle's own "best constitution" (described in Politics VII-VIII) each and every citizen will possess moral virtue and the equipment to carry it out in practice, and thereby attain a life of excellence and complete happiness (see VII.13.1332a32-8). All of the citizens will hold political office and possess private property because "one should call the city-state happy not by looking at a part of it but at all the citizens." (VII.9.1329a22-3). Moreover, there will be a common system of education for all the citizens, because they share the same end (Pol. VIII.1). But if (as is the case with most city-states) the population lacks the capacities and resources for complete happiness, the lawgiver must be content with fashioning a suitable constitution (Politics IV.11). The second-best system typically takes the form of a polity (in which citizens possess an inferior, more common grade of virtue) or mixed constitution (combining features of democracy, oligarchy, and aristocracy, so that no group of citizens is in a position to abuse its rights).
In addition, the political scientist must understand existing constitutions even when they are bad. Aristotle adds that "to reform a constitution is no less a task [of politics] than it is to establish one from the beginning," and in this way "the politician should also help existing constitutions." (IV.1.1289a1-7) The political scientist should also be cognizant of forces of political change which can undermine an existing regime. Aristotle criticizes his predecessors for excessive utopianism and neglect of the practical duties of a political theorist. However, he is no Machiavellian. The best constitution still serves as a regulative ideal by which to evaluate existing systems.
These topics occupy the remainder of the Politics. Books IV-VI are concerned with the existing constitutions: that is, the three deviant constitutions, as well as polity or the mixed constitution, the best attainable under most circumstances (IV.2.1289a26-38). The whole of book V investigates political change and revolution. Books VII-VIII are devoted to the ideal constitution. As might be expected, Aristotle's attempt to carry out this program involves many difficulties, and scholars disagree about how the two series of books (IV-VI and VII-VIII) are related to each other: for example, which were written first, which were intended to be read first, and whether they are ultimately consistent with each other. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:
Supplement: Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle's PoliticsAristotle's Politics did not have an immediate impact because it defended the Greek city-state, which was already becoming obsolete in his own lifetime. (As mentioned above, the Greek city-states permanently lost their independence due to the conquest by the kings of Macedon.) For similar reasons much of his discussion of particular political institutions is not directly applicable to modern nation-states (apart from his objectionable defenses of slavery, female subservience, and disenfranchisement of the working classes). Even so, Aristotle's Politics has had a deep influence on political philosophy until the present day, because it contains deep and thought-provoking discussions of perennial concerns of political philosophy: the role of human nature in politics, the relation of the individual to the state, the place of morality in politics, the theory of political justice, the rule of law, the analysis and evaluation of constitutions, the relevance of ideals to practical politics, the causes and cures of political change and revolution, and the importance of a morally educated citizenry.
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First published: July 1, 1998
Content last modified: July 19, 2002