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At the center of the controversy is the interpretation of Aristotle's definition of in. At Cat. 1a25 he says by in a subject I mean what is in something, not as a part, and cannot exist separately from what it is in. The definition is clearly ambiguous. On the one hand, it might mean that what is in a particular subject is incapable of existing separately from that subject. This is Ackrill's understanding:
x is in y =dfOn this understanding, the only thing that can, strictly speaking, be in a particular subject (e.g., Socrates) is something that cannot exist separately from that subject. The color in Socrates, in this sense, could not exist in anything else. Indeed, the only thing that can be in a particular substance, in this sense, is something that cannot exist separately from that substance.(a) x belongs to y, and
(b) x is not a part of y, and
(c) x cannot exist separately from y.
The problem for this reading of Aristotle's definition is that specific or generic universals (such as white and color) could not be in a particular substance; color could not be in Socrates because color can surely exist separately from Socrates. Yet Aristotle says (2b2) that color is in body, and therefore in an individual body (for if it were not in any individual, it would not be in body at all). Unless Aristotle is speaking carelessly here (as Ackrill supposes), his claim cannot be consistent with the definition of in, as Ackrill interprets it.
A second reading of Aristotle's definition is Owen's:
x is in y =dfOn this understanding, it is possible for a generic quality, such as white or color, to be in a particular substance. The reason that white can be in Socrates (as well as in other individuals) is that white belongs to (i.e., is a property of) Socrates, not a part of him, and is incapable of existing unless it belongs to some substance or other.
(a) x belongs to y, and (b) x is not a part of y, and (c) x cannot exist on its own (i.e., x cannot exist unless there is something z such that x belongs to z)
A third reading of Aristotle's definition is that of Frede 1987:
x is in a subject =dfFrede's reading is different from the other two in one important way, yet shares features of each. The difference is that on Frede's reading Aristotle is defining the one-place predicate x is in a subject, not the two-place predicate x is in y. That is, he is defining what it is to be an accident, the sort of thing that is in a subject, rather than what it is for x to be in y. This reading, like Owen's, allows a generic quality, such as white or color, to be in a particular substance. White can be in Socrates because it is an accident (i.e., it is an in a subject sort of thing) and belongs to (i.e., is a property of) Socrates. Yet, like Ackrill's, it has a specific inseparability requirement. That is, in order for x to be an accident, there must be some sort of thing that x is incapable of existing separately from. In the case of color, that thing is body.There is something, y, such that
(a) x is not a part of y, and
(b) x cannot exist independently of y.
There is a vast literature on this dispute. See, in addition to Ackrill and Owen: Matthews and Cohen 1968, Allen 1969, Duerlinger 1970, Jones 1972, Annas 1974, Hartman 1977, Granger 1980, Heinaman 1981a, Frede 1987, Matthews 1989, Devereux 1992, and Wedin 1993.
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First published: November 1, 2000
Content last modified: November 1, 2000