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There were three main types of analogy. In the original Greek sense, analogy involved a comparison of two proportions or relations. Thus principle was said to be an analogical term when said of a point and a spring of water because a point is related to a line as a spring is related to a river. This type of analogy came to be called the analogy of proportionality. In the second sense, analogy involved a relation between two things, of which one is primary and the other secondary. Thus healthy was said to be an analogical term when said of a dog and its food because while the dog has health in the primary sense, its food is healthy only secondarily as contributing to or causing the health of the dog. This second type of analogy became known as the analogy of attribution, and its special mark was being said in a prior and a posterior sense (per prius et posterius). A third type of analogy, sometimes appealed to by theologians, appealed to a relation of likeness between God and creatures. Creatures are called good or just because their goodness or justice imitates or reflects the goodness or justice of God. This type of analogy was called the analogy of imitation or participation. Of the three types, it is the analogy of attribution that is central to medieval discussions.
From the fourteenth century on discussions of analogy focused not so much on linguistic usages as on the nature of the concepts that corresponded to the words used. Is there just one concept that corresponds to an analogical term, or is there a sequence of concepts? If the latter, how are the members of the sequence ordered and related to each other? Moreover, how far should we distinguish between so-called formal concepts (or acts of mind) and objective concepts (whatever it is that is the object of the act of understanding)? These discussions were still influential at the time of Descartes.
Theories of signification were complicated by the metaphysical problem of common natures. If we say that words signify things external to and independent of the mind do we mean that a human being and beard signify special common objects such as humanity or beardedness, or do we mean that they signify Socrates and his beard? For some thinkers, the primary significate of a common noun was the common nature, and the secondary significate was the thing having that nature. For Aquinas, who did not want to give common natures any kind of intermediary existence independent of both concepts and actual things, the significate (significatum) of a term was the intellect's conception (whether simple or definitional) of the thing signified; the thing signified (res significata) was the property or the nature characterizing individual external objects; and the referent (suppositum) was the individual external object itself. In the fourteenth century, further developments took place. On the one hand, there was a new focus on the notion of a mental language superior to spoken language, and concepts, as parts of this mental language, were themselves regarded as having signification. On the other hand, William Ockham and his followers not only denied the existence of common natures but insisted that spoken words did not signify concepts. As a result, both spoken words and the concepts to which spoken words are subordinated have the same significates, namely individual things and their individual properties (e.g., the beardedness of Socrates).
In addition to having signification, terms were also said to have modes of signifying (modi significandi). These modes of signifying were related to the term's logical and grammatical functions, and include such essential features as being a noun, verb, or adjective, and such accidental features as time (which includes tense without being limited to it), gender, and case. More generally, they included being abstract (e.g., justice) and concrete (e.g. just). They also include modes of predication, related to Aristotle's ten categories, such as substantial (e.g. horse), qualitative (e.g., brown), quantitative (e.g. square), relative and so on. The notion of modes of signifying was developed from the early twelfth century on, though it was specially emphasized by the speculative grammarians of the late thirteenth century.
It is important to recognize that words were thought to be endowed as units both with their signification and with nearly all their modes of signifying in advance of the role they would subsequently play in propositions. Moreover, the doctrine of common natures suggested that terms, at least those terms which seem to fall within Aristotle's ten categories (substance, quality, quantity and so on), each correspond to a common nature and so have a signification which is fixed and precise. This meant that questions of use and context, though explored by medieval logicians, for instance through supposition theory, were not thought to be crucial to the determination of a term as equivocal, analogical or univocal. It also meant that terms which did not fit into Aristotle's categorial framework needed a special account. This problem relates especially to theology, because God was thought to transcend the categories in the sense that none of them apply to him, and also to metaphysics, because of the so-called transcendental terms, being, one, good. These transcend the categories in the sense that they belong no more to one category than to another, and they do not correspond to common natures.
One source for the theory of analogy is the doctrine of equivocal terms found in logic texts. Until the early twelfth century, the only parts of Aristotle's logic to be available in Latin were the Categories and On Interpretation, supplemented by a few other works including the monographs and commentaries of Boethius. The Categories opens with a brief characterization of terms used equivocally, such as animal used of real human beings and pictured human beings, and terms used univocally, such as animal used of human beings and oxen. In the first case, the spoken term is the same but there are two distinct significates or intellectual conceptions; in the second case, both the spoken term and the significate are the same. We should note that equivocal terms include homonyms (two words with the same form but different senses, e.g., pen), polysemous words (one word with two or more senses), and, for medieval thinkers, proper names shared by different people. By the mid-twelfth century the rest of Aristotle's logic had been recovered, including the Sophistical Refutations in which Aristotle discusses three types of equivocation and how these contribute to fallacies in logic. For writers throughout the later middle ages, the discussion of analogical terms was fitted into the framework of univocal and equivocal terms provided by Aristotle and his commentators. We will return to this below.
Twelfth-century theology is another important source for the doctrine of analogy, for twelfth-century theologians such as Gilbert of Poitiers and Alan of Lille explored the problem of divine language in depth. Their work initially sprang from works on the Trinity by Augustine and Boethius. These authors insisted that God is absolutely simple, so that no distinctions can be made between God's essence and his existence, or between one perfection, such as goodness, and another, such as wisdom, or, more generally, between God and his properties. New attention was also paid to Greek theologians, especially Pseudo-Dionysius. These theologians insisted on God's absolute transcendence, and on what came to be called negative theology. We cannot affirm anything positive about God, because no affirmation can be appropriate to a transcendent being. It is better to deny properties of God, saying for instance that he is not good (i.e., in the human sense), and still better to say that God is not existent but super-existent, not substance but super-substantial, not good but super-good. These theological doctrines raised the general problem of how we can speak meaningfully of God at all, but they also raised a number of particular problems. Must we say that "God is justice" means the same as "God is just"? Must we say that "God is just" means the same as "God is good"? Can we say that God is just and that Peter is just as well? For our purposes, this last question is the most important, for it raises the question of one word used of two different realities.
The third source for doctrines of analogy is metaphysics. The first part of Aristotle's Metaphysics had been translated by the mid-twelfth century, though the full text was recovered only gradually. One crucial text is found in Metaphysics 4.2 (1003a33-35): "There are many senses (multis modis) in which being (ens) can be said, but they are related to one central point (ad unum), one definite kind of thing, and are not equivocal. Everything which is healthy is related to health.... and everything which is medical to medicine...." In this text, Aristotle raises the general problem of the word being and its different senses, and he also introduces what is known as pros hen equivocation or focal meaning, the idea that different senses may be unified through a relationship to one central sense. Another foundational text is from Avicenna's Metaphysics, also translated into Latin during the twelfth century, where he writes that being (ens) is neither a genus nor a predicate predicated equally of all its subordinates, but rather a notion (intentio) in which they agree according to the prior and the posterior. As we shall see below, this reference to the prior and the posterior is particularly important.
So far as the medieval Latin west is concerned, the main sources for the notion of an ambiguous term said in a prior and a posterior sense are Algazel and Avicenna, both of whom became known in the second half of the twelfth century, and both of whom used the notion to explain uses of the word being. The word analogical soon replaced the word ambiguous in Latin authors. Alexander of Hales in his Glossa which dates from the 1220s links being said in a prior and a posterior sense with ambiguity and (in one manuscript) with analogy. In the writings of Philip the Chancellor from the same decade, being said in a prior and a posterior sense is called analogy. In logic, the word analogy in the new sense appears in the Summe metenses, once dated around 1220, but now thought to be by Nicholas of Paris, writing between 1240 and 1260. The new use of analogy rapidly became standard in both logicians and theologians.
The first of Boethius's four subdivisions was similitude, used of the case of the noun animal said of both real human beings and pictured human beings. Medieval logicians seem to have been totally unaware of the fact that the Greek word used by Aristotle was genuinely polysemous, meaning both animal and image, and they explained the extended use of animal in terms of a likeness between the two referents -- a likeness which had nothing to do with the significate of the term animal, which picks out a certain kind of nature, but which was nonetheless more than metaphorical in that the external shape of the pictured object does correspond to that of the living object. Those medieval authors whose discussion of equivocation was very brief tended to use this example, and they often claimed that Aristotle introduced it in order to accommodate analogy as a kind of equivocation. On the other hand, authors whose discussion was more extensive tended to drop both the example and the subdivision of similitude.
Boethius's second type of equivocation is analogia in the Greek sense, and the standard example was the word principium (principle or origin), which was said to apply to unity with respect to number and to point with respect to a line, or to both the source of a river and the heart of an animal. Principium is a noun and, as such, might be expected to pick out a common nature, but although a unity, a point, a source and a heart can all be called principium with equal propriety, there is no common nature involved. Mathematical objects, rivers, and hearts, represent not merely different natural kinds, but different categories, in that mathematical objects fall under the category of quantity, and hearts at least under the category of substance. What allows these disparate things to be grouped together is a similarity of relations: a source is to a river as a heart is to an animal -- or so it was claimed. While theologians, including Aquinas himself in De veritate, and the fourteenth-century Dominican Thomas Sutton, occasionally make use of this type of analogy, most logicians do not even mention it.
The last two subdivisions found in Boethius are of one origin (ab uno), with the example of the word medical, and in relation to one (ad unum), with the example of the word healthy. These subdivisions correspond to Aristotle's pros hen equivocation. The example healthy (sanum) as said of animals, their diet, and their urine is particularly important here. Sanum, like other adjectives, was classified as a concrete accidental term. As such, it did not fall within an Aristotelian category, since its primary signification had two elements whose combination was variously explained. On the one hand, some kind of reference is made to the abstract entity health, which belongs to the category of quality; on the other hand, some kind of reference is made to an external object which belongs to the category of substance. This dual reference precludes the term from picking out a natural kind, though in the case of other adjectives, such as brown, no problem is caused thereby. Brown things may not form a natural kind, but at least they are all physical objects, and brown is used in the same sense of each one. Healthy, however, is more complicated. To say that Rover is healthy is to say that Rover is a thing having health, and obviously this analysis can't be applied to diet, which is called healthy only because it causes health in an animal, or to urine, which is called healthy only when it is the sign of health in an animal. Whatever the properties which characterize urine and food, they are different from those characterizing the animal.
A second threefold division of analogy arose from reflection on the relationship between equivocal and analogical terms. Analogical terms were said to be intermediaries between equivocal and univocal terms, and the standard view was that analogical terms were intermediary between chance equivocals and univocals, and hence that they were to be identified with deliberate equivocals. The notion of an intermediary term, however, is open to more than one interpretation, and some authors went further in suggesting that at least some analogical terms were intermediary between univocals and deliberate equivocals, so that they were not equivocal in any of the normal senses at all. Towards the end of the thirteenth century, an anonymous commentator on the Sophistical Refutations gives the following classification. First, there are analogical terms which are univocal in a broad sense of univocal. Here reference was made to genus terms such as animal. Human beings and donkeys participate equally in the common nature animal, but are not themselves equal, since human beings are more perfect than donkeys. This type of analogy was routinely discussed in response to a remark Aristotle had made in Physics VII (249a22-25) which, in Latin translation, asserted that many equivocations are hidden in a genus. Medieval logicians felt obliged to fit this claim into the framework of equivocation and analogy, even if the consensus was that in the end the use of genus terms was univocal. Second, there are those analogical terms such as being (ens) which are not equivocal, because only one concept or nature (ratio) seems to be involved, and which are not univocal either, because things participate this one ratio unequally, in a prior and a posterior way. It is these terms which are the genuine intermediaries. Third, there are those analogical terms which are deliberate equivocals, because there are two concepts or natures (rationes) which are participated in a prior and a posterior way. The example here was healthy. This second threefold division was much discussed. Duns Scotus bitterly criticized it in his earlier logical writings. Walter Burley claimed that both the first and the second kinds of analogical term could properly be regarded as univocal in a wide sense. The division was popular in the fifteenth century with such Thomists as Capreolus, who realized its closeness to the account given by Aquinas in his Sentences commentary.
The background to this account has to be understood in terms of Aquinas's theology and metaphysics. Three doctrines are particularly important. First, there is the distinction between being existent, good, wise, and so on, essentially, and being existent, good, wise, and so on, by participation. God is whatever he is essentially, and as a result he is existence itself, goodness itself, wisdom itself. Creatures are existent, good, wise, only by sharing in God's existence, goodness, and wisdom, and this sharing has three features. It involves a separation between the creature and what the creature has; it involves a deficient similarity to God; and it is based on a causal relation. What is essentially existent or good is the cause of what has existence or goodness by participation. Second, there is the general doctrine of causality according to which every agent produces something like itself. Agent causality and similarity cannot be separated. Third, there is Aquinas's belief that we are indeed entitled to claim that God is existent, good, wise, and so on, even though we cannot know his essence.
Against this background, Aquinas asks how we are to interpret the divine names. He argues that they cannot be purely equivocal, for we could not then make intelligible claims about God. Nor can they be purely univocal, for God's manner of existence and his relationship to his properties are sufficiently different from ours that the words must be used in somewhat different senses. Hence, the words we use of God must be analogical, used in different but related senses. To be more precise, it seems that such words as good and wise must involve a relationship to one prior reality, and they must be predicated in a prior and a posterior sense, for these are the marks of analogical terms.
Nonetheless, the divine names do not function exactly like ordinary analogical terms such as healthy. We need to begin by making use of the distinction between the thing signified (a nature or property) and the mode of signifying. All the words we use have a creaturely mode of signifying in that they imply time and composition, neither of which can pertain to God. When speaking of God, we must recognize this fact, and attempt to discount it. To say "God is good" is not to imply that God has a separable property, goodness, and that he has it in a temporally limited way. God is eternally identical to goodness itself. But even when we have discounted the creaturely mode of signifying, we are left with the fact that God's goodness is not like our goodness. This is where the analogy of attribution enters the picture.
In his early writings, Aquinas questioned whether the standard account of the analogy of attribution was sufficient for his purposes. In his commentary on the Sentences, he suggests that there is one kind of analogy in which the analogical term is used in a prior and a posterior sense, and another kind of analogy, the analogy of imitation, which applies to God and creatures. In his De veritate, he argues that the analogy of attribution involves a determinate relation, which cannot hold between God and creatures, and that the analogy of proportionality must be used for the divine names. We must compare the relation between God and his properties to the relation between creatures and their properties. This solution was deeply flawed, given that the problem of divine names arises precisely because the relationship of God to his properties is so radically different from our relation to our properties. Accordingly, in his later discussions of the divine names, notably in the Summa contra gentiles and the Summa theologiae, Aquinas returns to the analogy of attribution, but links it much more closely with his doctrines of causal similitude. As Montagnes has pointed out, he came to place much greater emphasis on agent causation, the active transmission of properties from God to creatures, than on exemplar causality, the creature's passive reflection or imitation of God's properties. In this context, Aquinas makes considerable use of his ontological distinction between univocal causes, whose effects are fully like them, and non-univocal causes, whose effects are not fully like them. God is an analogical cause, and this is the reality that underlies our use of analogical language.
Aquinas's views about agent causality explain his insistence on definitional inclusion He says explicitly that the term said in a prior way must be included in the definition of the posterior, just as the definition of healthy food includes a reference to the health of the animal. In the divine case, the reference is not direct or explicit, but is a function of our recognition that when humans are said to be good, this means that they have a participated goodness which must be caused by that which is goodness itself. The nature of this causal relation between God and creature also helps to explain the sense in which terms are said in a prior way of God. So far as imposition is concerned, terms are given their signification on the basis of creaturely effects, and, before we learn about God, we may think that their prior use is to refer to creaturely perfections. However, when we come to know God as the first cause and fully perfect being, we recognize that their prior application is to God. Finally, Aquinas's causal doctrines help us to explain his insistence on the distinction between the analogy of many-to-one and the analogy of one-to-another. In the first case, both food and medicine are said to be healthy because each is related to something else, the health of an animal. In the second case, food is said to be healthy because of its relation to the health of an animal. Only the second kind of analogy applies to the divine names, for no non-metaphorical name we apply to God can ever be explained in terms of something other than God. Our use of divine names has to reflect God's absolute priority.
The issue was considerably complicated by the influence of John Duns Scotus and his argument that being was not analogical but univocal. Scotus believed that without a unified conception of being, theology as a science would be impossible, and we would have no natural knowledge of God. Accordingly, he rejected the view that for a term to be univocal it had to be a strictly categorial term, picking out some natural kind or other. He argued that it was sufficient for univocity that contradiction would arise when the term was affirmed and denied of the same thing. He then argued that being (ens) was a univocal term subordinated to a single univocal concept. Even for those within the Thomistic tradition, Scotus' arguments about the univocity of being had to be taken seriously. On the one hand, the word does not seem to be straightforwardly equivocal, in the sense of being subordinated to more than one concept, for we at least have the illusion of being able to grasp being as a general term. As Scotus pointed out, in an argument reproduced by all who considered the issue, we can grasp that something is a being while doubting whether it is a substance or an accident, and this surely involves having a relatively simple concept of being at our disposal. On the other hand, there does not seem to be any common nature involved, and in the absence of a common nature, Thomists thought that to call the term univocal was inappropriate. What was needed was a way of allowing the concept to enjoy some kind of unity, while allowing the word to have a significate that was not a simple common nature. For many thinkers from the early fourteenth century onward, the distinction between formal and objective concepts provided the answer.
The formal concept was the act of mind or conception that represented an object, and the objective concept was the object represented. If the spoken word being corresponds to just one formal concept (a point on which there were some differences of opinion), the focus of discussion shifts to the status of the objective concept. Is it the actual thing in the world which is thought about; is it a common nature or some other kind of intermediary entity which is distinct from the external object without being mind-dependent; or is it a special kind of mind-dependent object which has only objective being, the being of being thought (esse objective, esse cognitum)? In the case of being, since we are clearly not talking about either an individual thing or a common nature, we get back to the original set of questions about analogical concepts, now posed at a different level. That is, are we talking about a special ordering intrinsic to a single objective concept, or are we talking about an ordered sequence of objective concepts which corresponds to the one formal concept?
He called the third type of analogy the analogy of proportionality. It included metaphor and what he called proper proportionality. The latter, he said, is analogy in the Greek sense of the word, and is the only true kind of analogy. Moreover, it involves only intrinsic denomination: both the primary and the secondary object referred to are characterized by the property in question. While the word being can be used in accordance with attribution, Cajetan claimed that it, and all other metaphysically significant analogical terms, principally belonged in this last division. Both in his insistence on the priority of the analogy of proper proportionality and in his use of the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic denomination, Cajetan departed from earlier medieval discussions of analogy. Unfortunately, many later commentators have been misled into taking his account as a typical one, and, even more unfortunately, as a useful summary of the doctrines of Aquinas.
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First published: November 29, 1999
Content last modified: November 29, 1999