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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Affirmative Action


[1.] The legality of racial "set-asides" in public construction contracting remains an unresolved issue but the public in general is not aroused by the vicissitudes of the contracting process and the good or ill fortunes of construction firms.

[2.] Hugh Davis Graham, The Civil Rights Era: Origins and Development of National Policy 1960-1972 (New York: Oxford University Press, 1990), p. 413.

[3.] So profound was the shock to the academy that Nicholas Capaldi, writing in 1985, remained under the impression that "[a]ffirmative action as a public policy was first applied on a massive and national scale to institutions of higher learning." Nicholas Capaldi, Out of Order: Affirmative Action and the Crisis of Doctrinaire Liberalism (Buffalo, New York: Prometheus Books, 1985), p. 1.

[4.] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1971).

[5.] Thomas Nagel, "Equal Treatment and Compensatory Discrimination," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 2 (Summer 1973), 348-363.

[6.] Judith Jarvis Thomson, "Preferential Hiring," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 2 (Summer 1973), 364-484.

[7.] Ironically enough, the first discussions of "inverse" discrimination began in one of the prime sites of analytical philosophy, Analysis. For the full record of exchanges, see James W. Nickel, "Discrimination and Morally Relevant Characteristics," Analysis, 32 (March 1972), 113-14; J. L. Cowan, "Inverse Discrimination," Analysis, 33 (October 1972), 10-12; Paul Taylor, "Reverse Discrimination and Compensatory Justice," Analysis, 33 (June 1973), 177-82; Roger Shiner, "Individuals, Groups and Inverse Discrimination," Analysis, 33 (June 1973), 185-87; Philip Silvestri, "The Justification of Inverse Discrimination," Analysis, 34 (October 1973), 31; William A. Nunn, "Reverse Discrimination," Analysis, 34 (April 1974), 151-54; James W. Nickel, "Should Reparations Be to Individuals or Groups?" Analysis, 34 (April 1974), 154-60; Alan Goldman, "Reparations to Individuals or Groups?" Analysis, 35 (April 1975), 168-70; Sara Ann Ketchum and Christine Pierce, "Implicit Racism," Analysis, 36 (January, 1976), 91-5; Paul Woodruff, "What's Wrong with Discrimination?" Analysis, 36 (March 1976), 158-60; Robert L. Simon, "Statistical Justification of Discrimination," Analysis, 38 (January 1978), 37-42.

[8.] See, for example, Gertrude Ezorsky, "Hiring Women Faculty," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 7 (Autumn 1977), 86.

[9.] Alan Goldman, "Affirmative Action," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 5 (Winter 1976), 182-83.

[10.] Robert Simon, "Preferential Hiring: A Reply to Judith Jarvis Thomson," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 3 (Spring 1974), 315-19; George Sher, Justifying Reverse Discrimination in Employment," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 4 (Winter 1975), 162; George Sher, "Reverse Discrimination, the Future, and the Past," Ethics, 90 (October 1979), 81-2; Alan Goldman, "Affirmative Action," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 5 (Winter 1976), 190-1. See also Robert K. Fullinwider, "Preferential Hiring and Compensation," Social Theory and Practice (Spring 1975), 307-320; Alan Goldman, Justice and Reverse Discrimination (Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1979), 65-102; Robert K. Fullinwider, The Reverse Discrimination Controversy: A Moral and Legal Analysis (Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman & Littlefield, 1980), pp. 30-44.

[11.] Thomson, "Preferential Hiring," p. 377; Simon, "Preferential Hiring: A Reply," 312.

[12.] Goldman, "Affirmative Action," p. 191; Goldman, Justice and Reverse Discrimination, pp. 24-8.

[13.] Barry R. Gross, "Is Turn About Fair Play?" in Barry R. Gross, ed., Reverse Discrimination (Buffalo, New York: Prometheus Books, 1977), p. 382; Barry R. Gross, Discrimination in Reverse: Is Turnabout Fair Play (New York: New York University Press, 1978), p. 97.

[14.] Robert L. Simon, "Individual Rights and ‘Benign’ Discrimination," Ethics, 90 (October 1979), 96.

[15.] Terry Eastland and William Bennett, Counting By Race: Equality from the Founding Fathers to Bakke and Weber (New York: Basic Books, 1979), 144.

[16.] Gross, Discrimination in Reverse, 125-42.

[17.] Mary Anne Warren, "Secondary Sexism and Quota Hiring," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 6 (Spring 1977), 256.

[18.] James Rachels, "What People Deserve," in John Arthur and William Shaw, eds., Justice and Economic Distribution (Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey, Prentice-Hall, 1978), 162.

[19.] See Sher, "Justifying Reverse Discrimination," 165ff.

[20.] Lisa Newton, "Reverse Discrimination as Unjustified," Ethics, 83 (July 1973), 310. Similar sentiments were expressed by Virginia Black:

If it is irrational and unjust and cruel to fire someone because he is a black or she is a woman -- cases whose absurdity seems obvious -- then it is equally irrational and unjust and cruel to hire someone because be is a black or she is a woman. To appreciate the parallel, one has only to remember that to hire X because of color is, ipso facto, not to hire Y because of color. When inscribed in law, this is racism.

Virginia Black, "The Erosion of Legal Principles in the Creation of Legal Policies," Ethics, 84 (January 1974), 106

[21.] Eastland and Bennett, Counting By Race, 149. This idea that using racial preferences involved a kind of practical contradiction was given voice and support at the highest levels of government in the 1980s. William Bradford Reynolds, during his tenure as Assistant Attorney General for Civil Rights in the Reagan Administration, contended:

[T]o those who argue that we must use race to get beyond racism . . . [h]istory teaches us all too well that such an approach does not work. It is wrong when the government bestows advantages on whites at the expense of innocent blacks; it assumes no greater claim of morality if the tables are turned … . Whatever group membership one inherits, it carries with it no entitlement to preferential treatment over those not similarly endowed with the same immutable characteristics. Any compromise of this principle is discrimination, plain and simple, and such behavior is no more tolerable when employed remedially, in the name of "affirmative action" or "racial balance," to bestow a gratuitous advantage on members of a particular group, than when it is divorced from such beneficence and for the most invidious of reasons works to one's disadvantage.

William Bradford Reynolds, "Individualism vs. Group Rights: The Legacy of Brown," Yale Law Journal, 93 (May 1984), 1004. While Reynolds found the proposition, "Use race to achieve a colorblind society," an assault on logic, he belonged to an administration whose defense policy -- like that of a long line of administrations -- was grounded on the proposition, "Prepare for war in order to have peace."

[22.] Richard Wasserstrom, "Racism, Sexism, and Preferential Treatment: An Approach to the Topics," UCLA Law Review, 24 (February 197), 581-622.

[23.] Carl Cohen, Naked Racial Preference (Lanham, Maryland: Madison Books, 1995), 20 (from "Race and the Constitution," first published in The Nation, 220 [February 8, 1975]).

[24.] Cohen, Naked Racial Preference, 52 (from "Who Are Equals?" first published in National Forum: The Phi Kappa Phi Journal, 58 (Winter 1978).

[25.] Goldman, Justice and Reverse Discrimination, 164-65.

[26.] Title 42 United States Code Sec. 2000d. Title IX of the Education Amendments of 1972 promised the same protection against gender discrimination. See 20 USC 1681.

[27.] "(a) … It shall be … unlawful for an employer -- (1) to . . . refuse to hire or to discharge any individual, or otherwise to discriminate against any individual with respect to his compensation, terms, conditions, or privileges of employment, because of such individual's race, color, religion, sex, or national origin; or (2) to limit, segregate, or classify his employees or applicants in any way which would tend to deprive any individual of employment opportunities or otherwise adversely affect his status as an employee, because of such individual's race, color, religion, sex, or national origin … ." Title 42 USC Sec 2000e-2

[28.] Griggs v. Duke Power Company, 401 U.S. 424 (1971), at 430, 431. At issue in the case was the use of an aptitude test and a high-school graduation requirement to screen job applicants. Duke Power Company did not succeed in showing that the results of the aptitude test or the possession of a high school diploma bore any demonstrable relation to performance at such of its jobs as janitor, maintenance worker, and the like.

[29.] For a more extended discussion of goals and quotas, see Fullinwider, The Reverse Discrimination Controversy, 162-177.

[30.] Consider, for example, this 1969 court decision involving a union with a record of excluding blacks and Mexican-Americans. the court imposed an injunction that

prohibit[ed] discrimination in excluding persons from union membership or referring persons for work; prohibit[ed] use of member's endorsements, family relationship or elections as criteria for membership; … ordered the development of objective membership criteria and prohibited new members … until developed; and ordered continuation of chronological referrals for work, with alternating white and Negro referrals until objective membership criteria are developed.

On appeal, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit upheld the lower court. In its view,

[t]he District Court did no more than prevent future discrimination when it prohibited a continuing exclusion of Negroes through the application of an apparently neutral membership provision … which served no significant trade-related purpose. [Further] the District Court did no more [in barring new membership until objective criteria were developed] than ensure that the injunction against further racial discrimination would be fairly administered. Absent objective criteria … covert subversion of the purpose of the injunction could occur. The same administrative reasons support alternating white and Negro referrals … .

Asbestos Workers v. Vogler, 407 F. 2d 1047 (1960), at 1051, 1055. Each part of the lower court's order, including the part that required racially balanced referrals, harkened back to a single ground: the part was necessary to prevent future discrimination.

[31.] For a list of Circuit Court decisions embracing this theory, see Robert K. Fullinwider, "Achieving Equal Opportunity," in Robert K. Fullinwider and Claudia Mills, eds., The Moral Foundations of Civil Rights (Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman & Littlefield, 1986), 106-08 and accompanying footnotes.

[32.] Regents of the University of California v. Bakke, 438, U.S. 265 (1978). In 1974, the Court accepted for decision a similar case involving a race-preference policy at the University of Washington Law School. However, perhaps experiencing second thoughts, the Court then dismissed the case as moot (the plaintiff, admitted to the Law School by a lower court, was about to graduate). See De Funis v. Odegaard, 416 U.S. 312 (1974).

[33.] Unlike Title VII, which was grounded in the Interstate Commerce Clause of the Constitution, Title VI was grounded in the federal government's spending powers. Brennan relied on Congressional debate to argue for the substantive identity of Title VI, on the one hand, and the Fourteenth Amendment to the Constitution, which forbids states to discriminate, and the Fifth Amendment, which incorporates the Fourteenth Amendment's strictures and applies them to the federal government, on the other hand. The debate can be summed up in this rhetorical question: "Why should the government through its spending be subsidizing acts of private discrimination that it would be forbidden by the Constitution to do itself?" See 438 U.S. 265, at 329-336.

[34.] 438 U. S. 265, at 295-300 (Powell quoting from Archibald Cox, The Role of the Supreme Court in American Government [New York: Oxford University Press, 1976], 114).

[35.] 438 U.S. 265, at 300.

[36.] 438 U.S. 265, at 307.

[37.] 438 U.S. 265, at 308.

[38.] 438 U.S. 265, at 310. Here Powell suggests that the threshold for justified preferences under the Constitution is exactly the same as the one for their use under Title VII: preferences may be used by an institution to prevent its own present and future discrimination. Justice Scalia takes this suggestion to stand for the Court's current settled doctrine. See Richmond v. J. A. Croson Company, 488 U.S. 469 (1989) (Scalia concurring).

[39.] 438 U.S. 265, at 311.

[40.] 438 U.S. 265, at 316.

[41.] 438 U. S. 265, at 318, 319.

[42.] Podberesky v. Kirwan, 38 F. 3d 147 (Fourth Circuit, 1994).

[43.] Hopwood v. Texas, 78 F 3d 932 (Fifth Circuit, 1996).

[44.] Wessmann v. Gittens, 106 F 3d 798 (First Circuit, 1998).

[45.] Johnson v. Board of Regents, 263 F 3d 1234 (Eleventh Circuit, 2001).

[46. Grutter v. Bollinger, 137 F. Supp. 2d 821 (2001).

[47.] See Wygant v. Jackson, 476 U.S. 267 (1986); Richmond v. J. A. Croson Company, 488 U.S. 469 (1989); Adarand Constructors v. Pena, 515 U.S. 200 (1995).

[48.] 438 U.S. 265, at 358.

[49.] 438 U.S. 265, at 376.

[50.] 438 U.S. 265, at 363.

[51.] A clear discussion of Bakke and equality's dictates can be found in "Bakke's Case: Are Quotas Really Unfair?" and "What Did Bakke Really Decide?" in Ronald Dworkin, A Matter of Principle (Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1985).

[52.] Georgia Warnke, "Affirmative Action, Neutrality, and Integration," Journal of Social Philosophy, 29 (1998), 87-103.

[53.] Chang-Lin Tien, "A Personal Perspective on Affirmative Action," in Robert Post and Michael Rogin, eds., Race and Representation: Affirmative Action (New York: Zone Books, 1998), 379-83.

[54.] Carl Cohen, "The Corruption That Is Group Preference," Academic Questions, 11 (Summer 1998), 14-21.

[55.] Francis J. Beckwith and Todd E. Jones, eds., Affirmative Action: Social Justice or Reverse Discrimination?" (Amherst, New York: Prometheus Books, 1997); Steven M. Cahn, ed., The Affirmative Action Debate (New York: Routledge, 1995). Of the twenty-two chapters in Cahn, only four postdate 1990; of the fifteen chapters in Beckwith and Jones, only one by a philosopher postdates 1990 (one other reworks material written in the 1980s).

[56.] Some recent philosophical work on affirmative action: Albert G. Mosley and Nicholas Capaldi, Affirmative Action: Social Justice or Unfair Preference? (Lanham, Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield, 1996); Albert G. Mosley, "Policies of Straw or Policies of Inclusion? A Review of Pojman's ‘Case Against Affirmative Action’," International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 12 (1998), 161-168; Louis Pojman, "Straw Man or Straw Theory? A Reply to Albert Mosley," International Journal of Applied Philosophy, 12 (1998), 169-80; Francis J. Beckwith, "The ‘No One Deserves His or Her Talents’ Argument for Affirmative Action," Social Theory and Practice, 25 (1999), 53-60; Sarah Stroud, "The Aim of Affirmative Action," Social Theory and Practice, 25 (1999), 385-408; Stephen Kershnar, "Strong Affirmative Action Programs and Disproportionate Burdens," Journal of Value Inquiry, 33 (1999), 201-209.

[57.] Neil Rudenstine, "Why a Diverse Student Body Is So Important," Chronicle of Higher Education, 42 (April 19, 1996), B1.

[58.] Elizabeth Anderson, in "The Democratic University: The Role of Justice in the Production of Knowledge," in Ellen Frankel Paul et al., eds. The Just Society (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1995), 186-219, makes a complementary argument. It parallels Rudenstine's, but emphasizes epistemic rather than educational considerations and applies to faculty and graduate students rather than undergraduates. "A knowledge claim gains objectivity and warrant," Anderson insists, "to the degree that it is the product of exposure to the fullest range of criticisms and perspectives … . Universities [should] recruit students and faculty to ensure broad representation of people from all walks of life, so that the products of inquiry are open to critical scrutiny and influence from the widest range of viewpoints, and so that the subjects and direction of inquiry are responsive to the widest range of interests" (203, 198). But Anderson goes further than simply commending broad representation. She maintains that

[t]he internal knowledge-promoting aims of the university call for measures to promote equality of access by all groups in society to membership in its ranks. This is an argument for affirmative action in university admissions and faculty hiring that recognizes the positive contributions that members of oppressed groups can and do make to enhancing the objectivity of research. Equality of access through affirmative action policies is not, therefore, an external political goal that threatens to compromise the quality of research. It is a means to promote the objectivity of that research (198).

For a discussion of her argument, see Robert K. Fullinwider, "Diversity and Affirmative Action," Report from the Institute for Philosophy and Public Policy, 17 (Winter/ Spring 1997), 26-31.

[59.] Gratz v. Bollinger, 122 F. Supp. 2d 811 (2000), at 823.

[60.] Recall that Justice Powell put the university's interest in diversity under the umbrella of academic freedom which is protected by the First Amendment of the Constitution. It is this latter connection that makes the university's interest legally "compelling." In this sense, the university's interest in admitting tuba players is as compelling as its interest in admitting racial minorities.

[61.] Gratz v. Bollinger, 135 F. Supp. 2d 790 (2001), at 796-797.

[62.] William G. Bowen and Derek Bok, The Shape of the River: Long-Term Consequences of Considering Race in College and University Admissions (Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press, 1998), 7.

[63.] Stephan Thernstrom and Abigail Thernstrom, America in Black and White: One Nation, Indivisible (New York" Simon and Schuster, 1997), 395-411.

[64.] Bowen and Bok, The Shape of the River, 63, 114, 144.

[65.] For critiques of The Shape of the River, see Terrance Sandalow, "Identity and Equality: Minority Preferences Reconsidered," Michigan Law Review, 97 (May 1999), 1874-1916, and Stephan Thernstrom and Abigail Thernstrom, "Reflections on The Shape of the River," UCLA Law Review, 46 (June 1999), 1583-1631.

[66.] James Traub, "The Class of Prop 209," New York Times Sunday Magazine, May 2, 1999, 44ff.

[67.] Bowen and Bok, The Shape of the River, 46-50.

[68.] Christopher Edley, Jr., Not All Black and White: Affirmative Action and American Values (New York: Hill and Wang, 1996), 132ff. Edley's example involved a coal miner's daughter. I've changed the daughter to a son for expository purposes.

[69.] Charles R. Lawrence III and Mari J. Matsuda, We Won't Go Back: Making the Case for Affirmative Action (Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company, 1997), 199-1.

[70.] Bernard Boxill has insisted that merely receiving benefits produced by injustice is enough to make one personally liable to compensate the victim of injustice (Bernard Boxill, "The Morality of Reparations," Social Theory and Practice, 2 [Spring 1972], 113-123). And who is the victim of injustice? "We know that all blacks, lower class, middle class, and upper class, have been wronged by racial injustice" (Bernard Boxill, Blacks and Social Justice [Totowa, New Jersey: Rowman and Allanheld, 1984], 164). In "The Morality of Preferential Hiring," Philosophy & Public Affairs, 7 (Spring 1978), 251, Boxill argues that in affirmative action the correlation between "preferences received" and "compensation deserved," though not perfect, is very high.

[71.] 438 U.S. 265, at 365-6.

[72.] Michel Rosenfeld, Affirmative Action and Justice: A Philosophical Inquiry (New Haven, Connecticut: Yale University Press, 1991), 307-8. Emphasis added.

[73.] Lawrence and Matsuda, We Won't Go Back, 252.

Copyright © 2001 by
Robert K. Fullinwider

First published: December 28, 2001
Content last modified: December 28, 2001