|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
"Affirmative action" means positive steps taken to increase the representation of women and minorities in areas of employment, education, and business from which they have been historically excluded. When those steps involve preferential selection -- selection on the basis of race, gender, or ethnicity -- affirmative action generates intense controversy.
The development, defense, and contestation of preferential affirmative action has proceeded in two streams. One has been legal and administrative, as courts, legislatures, and executive departments of government have applied laws and rules requiring affirmative action. The other has been public debate, where the practice of preferential treatment has spawned a vast literature, pro and con. Often enough, the two streams have failed to make adequate contact, with the public quarrels not always very securely anchored in any existing legal basis or practice.
The ebb and flow of public controversy over affirmative action can be pictured as two spikes on a line, the first spike representing a period of passionate debate that began around 1972 and tapered off after 1980, and the second indicating a resurgence of debate in the 1990s. The first spike encompassed controversy about gender and racial preferences alike. This is because in the beginning, affirmative action was as much about the factory, firehouse, and corporate suite as about the university campus. The second spike represents a quarrel about race. This is because the only burning issue now is about preferential admissions in higher education.
In 1972, affirmative action became an inflammatory public issue. True enough, the Civil Rights Act of 1964 had made something called "affirmative action" a remedy federal courts could impose on violators of the Act. Likewise, since 1965, federal contractors had been subject to President Lyndon Johnson's Executive Order 11246, requiring them to take "affirmative action" to make sure they were not discriminating. But what did this 1965 mandate amount to? The Executive Order assigned to the Secretary of Labor the job of specifying rules of implementation. In the meantime, as the federal courts were enforcing the Civil Rights Act against discriminating companies, unions, and other institutions, the Department of Labor mounted an ad hoc attack on the construction industry, cajoling, threatening, negotiating, and generally strong-arming reluctant construction firms into a series of region-wide "plans," in which they committed themselves to numerical hiring goals. Through these contractor commitments, the Department could indirectly pressure recalcitrant labor unions, who supplied the employees at job sites.
While the occasional court case and government initiative made the news and stirred some controversy, affirmative action was pretty far down the list of public excitements until the autumn of 1972, when the Secretary of Labor's Revised Order No. 4, fully implementing the Executive Order, landed on campus by way of directives from the Department of Health, Education, and Welfare. Its predecessor, Order No. 4, first promulgated in 1970, cast a wide net over American institutions, both public and private. By extending to all contractors the basic apparatus of the construction industry "plans," the Order imposed a one-size-fits-all system of "underutilization analyses," "goals," and "timetables" on hospitals, banks, trucking companies, steel mills, printers, aircraft manufacturers -- indeed, on all the scores of thousands of institutions, large and small, that did business with the government -- including a special set of institutions with a particularly voluble and articulate constituency, namely, American universities.
At first, university administrators and faculty found the new rules murky but hardly a threat to the established order. The number of racial and ethnic minorities receiving PhDs each year was tiny. Any mandate to increase their representation on faculties would require more diligent searches by universities, to be sure, but searches nevertheless fated largely to mirror past results. The Revised Order, on the other hand, effected a change that punctured any campus complacency: it included women among the "protected classes" whose "underutilization" demanded the setting of "goals" and "timetables" for their "full utilization." Unlike blacks and Hispanics, women were getting PhDs in substantial and growing numbers. If the affirmative action required of federal contractors was a recipe for "proportional representation," then Revised Order No. 4 was bound to leave a large footprint on campus. Some among the professoriate exploded in a fury of opposition to the new rules, while others responded with an equally vehement defense of them.
As it happened, these events coincided with another development, namely the "public turn" in philosophy. For several decades Anglo-American philosophy had treated moral and political questions obliquely. On the prevailing view, philosophers were competent to do "conceptual analysis" -- to lay bare, for example, the conceptual architecture of the idea of justice -- but they were not competent to suggest political principles, constitutional arrangements, or social policies that actually did justice. Philosophers might do "meta-ethics" but not "normative ethics." This viewed collapsed in the 1970s under the weight of two counter-blows. First, John Rawls published in 1971 A Theory of Justice, an elaborate, elegant, and inspiring defense of a normative theory of justice. Second, in the same year Philosophy & Public Affairs, with Princeton University's impeccable pedigree, began life, a few months after Florida State's Social Theory and Practice. These journals, along with a re-tooled older periodical, Ethics, became self-conscious platforms for socially and politically engaged philosophical writing, born out of the feeling that in time of war (the Vietnam War) and social tumult (the Civil Rights Movement, women's liberation), philosophers ought to do, not simply talk about, ethics. In 1973, Philosophy & Public Affairs published Thomas Nagel's "Equal Treatment and Compensatory Justice" and Judith Jarvis Thomson's "Preferential Hiring," and the philosophical literature on affirmative action burgeoned forth.
In contention was the nature of those "goals" and "timetables" imposed on every contractor by Revised Order No. 4. Weren't the "goals" tantamount to "quotas," requiring institutions to use racial or gender preferences in their selection processes? Some answered "no." Properly understood, affirmative action did not require (or even permit) the use of gender or racial preferences. Others said "yes." Affirmative action, if it did not impose preferences outright, at least countenanced them. Among the yea-sayers, opinion divided between those who said preferences were morally indefensible and those who said they were not. Within this last set, different people put forward different justifications.
The essays by Thomson and Nagel both defended the use of preferences but on different grounds. Thomson defended job preferences for women and blacks as a form of compensation for their past exclusion from the academy and the workplace. Preferential policies, in her view, worked a kind of justice. Nagel, by contrast, thought that preferences might work a kind of social good, and without doing violence to justice. Institutions could for one or another good reason properly depart from standard meritocratic selection criteria because the whole system of tying economic reward to earned credentials was itself indefensible.
Justice and desert lay at the heart of subsequent arguments. Several writers took to task Thomson's argument that preferential hiring justifiably makes up for past wrongs. Preferential hiring seen as compensation looks perverse, they contended, since it benefits individuals (blacks and women possessing good educational credentials) least likely harmed by past wrongs while it burdens individuals (younger white male applicants) least likely to be responsible for past wrongs. Instead of doing justice, preferential treatment violates rights (the right of an applicant "to equal consideration," the right of the maximally competent to a position, the right of everyone to equal opportunity) and confounds desert (by severing reward from a "person's character, talents, choices and abilities;" by "subordinating merit, conduct, and character to race;" by disconnecting outcomes from actual liability and damage).
Defenders of preferences were no less quick to enlist justice and desert in their cause. Mary Anne Warren, for example, argued that in a context of entrenched gender discrimination, gender preferences might improve the "overall fairness" of job selections. Justice and individual desert need not be violated.
If individual men's careers are temporarily set back because of . . . [job preferences given to women], the odds are good that these same men will have benefited in the past and/or will benefit in the future -- not necessarily in the job competition, but in some ways -- from sexist discrimination against women. Conversely, if individual women receive apparently unearned bonuses [through preferential selection], it is highly likely that these same women will have suffered in the past and/or will suffer in the future from . . . sexist attitudes.
Likewise, James Rachels defended racial preferences as devices to neutralize unearned advantages by whites. Given the pervasiveness of racial discrimination, it is likely, he argued, that the superior credentials offered by white applicants do not reflect their greater effort, desert, or even ability. Rather, the credentials reflect their mere luck at being born white. "Some white . . . [applicants] have better qualifications . . . only because they have not had to contend with the obstacles faced by their black competitors." Rachels was less confident than Warren that preferences worked uniformly accurate offsets. Reverse discrimination might do injustice to some whites; yet its absence would result in injustices to blacks who have been unfairly handicapped by their lesser advantages.
Rachels' diffidence was warranted in light of the counter-responses. If racial and gender preferences for jobs (or college admissions) were supposed to neutralize unfair competitive advantages, they needed to be calibrated to fit the variety of backgrounds aspirants brought to any competition for these goods. Simply giving blanket preferences to blacks or women seemed a much too ham-handed approach if the point was to micro-distribute opportunities fairly.
To many of its critics, reverse discrimination was simply incoherent. When "the employers and the schools favor women and blacks," objected Lisa Newton, they commit the same injustice perpetrated by Jim Crow discrimination. "Just as the previous discrimination did, this reverse discrimination violates the public equality which defines citizenship."
William Bennett and Terry Eastland likewise saw racial preferences as in some sense illogical:
To count by race, to use the means of numerical equality to achieve the end of moral equality, is counterproductive, for to count by race is to deny the end by virtue of the means. The means of race counting will not, cannot, issue in an end where race does not matter.
When Eastland and Bennett alluded to those who favored using race to get to a point where race doesn't count, they had in mind specifically the Supreme Court's Justice Blackmun who, in the famous 1978 Bakke case (discussed below), put his own views in just those simple terms. The legitimacy of racial preferences was to be measured by how fast using them moved us toward a society where race doesn't matter (a view developed in subtle detail by the philosopher Richard Wasserstrom). While the critics of preferences feigned to find the very idea of using race to end racism illogical and incoherent, they also fell back on principle to block this instrumental defense should it actually prove both reasonable and plausible. "The moral issue comes in classic form," wrote Carl Cohen. "Terribly important objectives . . . appear to require impermissible means. Might we not wink at the Constitution this once" and allow preferences to do their good work? Neither Cohen nor the other critics thought so. Principle must hold firm. "[I]n the distribution of benefits under the laws all racial classifications are invidious."
But what, exactly, is the principle -- Constitutional or moral -- that bars the use of race as a means to "terribly important objectives"? Alan Goldman did more than anyone in the early debate to formulate and ground a relevant principle. Using a contractualist framework, he surmised that rational contractors would choose a rule of justice requiring positions to be awarded by competence. They would choose this rule because it instantiates a principle of equal opportunity which in turn instantiates a broad right to equal consideration of interests, this last principle springing from the basic condition of the contracting parties as rational, self-interested, and equally situated choosers. On its face, the rule of competence would seem to preclude filling positions by reference to factors like race and gender that are unrelated to competence. However, Goldman's "rule" blocked preferences only under certain empirical conditions. Goldman explained the derivation of the rule and its consequent limit this way:
The rule for hiring the most competent was justified as part of a right to equal opportunity to succeed through socially productive effort, and on grounds of increased welfare for all members of society. Since it is justified in relation to a right to equal opportunity, and since the application of the rule may simply compound injustices when opportunities are unequal elsewhere in the system, the creation of more equal opportunities takes precedence when in conflict with the rule for awarding positions. Thus short-run violations of the rule are justified to create a more just distribution of benefits by applying the rule itself in future years.
In other words, if "terribly important objectives" -- especially objectives having to do with equalizing opportunities in a system rife with inequality -- could in fact be furthered by measured and targeted reverse discrimination, justice wouldn't stand in the way. Thus, Goldman's rule did not have the adamantine character Cohen and other critics sought in a bar to preferences. Where can such an unyielding principle be found? I postpone further examination of this question until I discuss the Bakke case, below, whose split opinions constitute an extended debate on the meaning of Constitutional equality.
The terms of the popular debate over racial and gender preferences mirrored the arguments philosophers and other academics were making to each other. Preference's defenders offered many reasons to justify them, reasons having to do with compensatory or distributive justice, as well as reasons having to do with social utility (more blacks in the police department would enable it better to serve the community, more female professors in the classroom would inspire young women to greater achievements). Critics of preferences retorted by pointing to the law. And well they should, since the text of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 seemed a solid anchor even if general principle proved elusive. Title VI of the Act promised that "[n]o person . . . shall, on the ground of race, color, or national origin, be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving Federal financial assistance." Title VII prohibited all employment practices that discriminated on the basis of race, gender, religion, or national origin. However, unlike Title VI, Title VII went on to spell out some exceptions. Under special circumstances, the Title permitted the use of gender, religion, and national origin as legitimate bases for employer selection. But it made no such exception for race. While being a woman or being a Roman Catholic could sometimes count as a legitimate occupational qualification, being black could not.
In face of the plain language of Titles VI and VII, how did preferential hiring and promotion ever arise in the first place? How could it be justified legally? The answer lay in the meaning of "discrimination." The Civil Rights Act did not define the term. The federal courts had to do that job themselves, and the cases before them drove the definition in a particular direction. Many factories and businesses prior to 1964, especially in the South, had in place facially discriminatory policies and rules. For example, a company's policy might have relegated blacks to the maintenance department and channeled whites into operations, sales, and management departments, where the pay and opportunities for advancement were far better. After passage of the Civil Rights Act, suppose the company willingly abandoned its facially segregative policy. Yet it could still carry forward the effects of its past segregation through other already-existing facially neutral rules. For example, a rule requiring workers to give up their seniority in one department if they transferred to another would have locked in place older black maintenance workers as effectively as the prior segregative rule that made them ineligible to transfer at all. Consequently, courts began striking down facially neutral rules that carried through the effects of an employer's past discrimination, regardless of the original intent or provenance of the rules. "Intent" was effectively decoupled from "discrimination." In 1971, the Supreme Court ratified this process, giving in the Griggs decision the following construction of Title VII:
The objective of Congress in the enactment of Title VII . . . was to achieve equality of employment opportunities and remove barriers that have operated in the past to favor an identifiable group of white employees over other employees. Under the Act, practices, procedures, or tests neutral on their face, and even neutral in terms of intent, cannot be maintained if they operate to "freeze" the status quo of prior discriminatory employment practices.
What is required by Congress is the removal of artificial, arbitrary, and unnecessary barriers to employment when the barriers operate invidiously to exclude on the basis of racial or other impermissible classification.
In a few short paragraphs the Court moved from proscribing practices that froze in place the effects of a firm's own past discrimination to proscribing practices that carried through the effects of past discrimination generally. The Court characterized statutory discrimination as any exclusionary practice not necessary to an institution's activities. Since many practices in most institutions were likely to be exclusionary, rejecting minorities and women in greater proportion than white men, all institutions needed to reassess the full range of their practices to look for, and correct, discriminatory effect. Against this backdrop, the generic idea of affirmative action took form:
Each institution should effectively monitor its practices for exclusionary effect and revise those that cannot be defended as "necessary" to doing business. In order to make its monitoring and revising effective, an institution ought to predict, as best it can, how many minorities and women it would select over time, were it successfully nondiscriminating. These predictions constitute the institution's affirmative action "goals," and failure to meet the goals signals to the institution (and to the government) that it needs to revisit its efforts at eliminating exclusionary practices. There may still remain practices that ought to be modified or eliminated.
The point of such affirmative action: induce change in institutions so that they could comply with the nondiscrimination mandate of the Civil Rights Act.
However, what if this self-monitoring and revising fell short? In early litigation under the Civil Rights Act, courts concluded that some institutions, because of their past exclusionary histories and present failure to find qualified women or minorities, needed stronger medicine. Courts ordered these institutions to adopt "quotas," to take in specific numbers of formerly excluded groups, on the assumption that once these new workers were securely lodged in place, the institutions would adapt to this new reality.
Throughout the 1970s, courts and government enforcement agencies extended this idea across the board, requiring a wide range of firms and organizations -- from AT&T to the Alabama Highway Patrol -- temporarily to select by the numbers. In all these cases, the use of preferences was tied to a single purpose: to prevent ongoing and future discrimination. Courts carved out this justification for preferences not through caprice but through necessity. They found themselves confronted with a practical dilemma that Congress had never envisaged and thus never addressed when it wrote the Act. The dilemma was this: courts could impose racial preferences to change foot-dragging or inept defendants (thus transgressing the text of Title VII) or they could order less onerous steps they knew to be ineffective, thus letting discrimination continue (and violating their duty under Title VII). Reasonably enough, the federal courts resolved this dilemma by appeal to the broad purposes of the Civil Rights Act and justified racial preferences where needed to prevent ongoing and future discrimination.
Thus, preferential affirmative action served the same rationale as the non-preferential sort. Its purpose was not to compensate for past wrongs, offset unfair advantage, appropriately reward the deserving and undeserving, or yield a variety of social goods; its purpose was to change institutions so they could comply with the nondiscrimination mandate of the Civil Rights Act.
In the 1970s, while campuses were embroiled in debate about how to increase blacks and women on the faculty, universities were also putting into effect schemes to increase minority presence within the student body. Very selective universities, in particular, needed new initiatives because only a relative handful of black and Hispanic high school students possessed test scores and grades good enough to make them eligible for admission. These institutions faced a choice: retain their admissions criteria unchanged and accept the upshot -- hardly any blacks and Hispanics on campus -- or fiddle with their criteria to get a more substantial representation. Most elected the second path.
The Medical School of the University of California at Davis was typical. It reserved sixteen of the one hundred slots in its entering classes for minorities. In 1973 and again in 1974, Allan Bakke, a white applicant, was denied admission although his test scores and grades were better than most or all of those admitted through the special program. He sued. In 1977, his case, Regents of the University of California v. Bakke, reached the Supreme Court. The Court rendered its decision a year later.
An attentive reader of Title VI of the Civil Rights Act might have thought this case was an easy call. So, too, thought four justices on the Supreme Court, who voted to order Bakke admitted to the Medical School. Led by Justice Stevens, they saw the racially segregated, two-track scheme at the Medical School, which was a recipient of federal funds, as a clear violation of the plain language of the Title.
Four other members of the Court, led by Justice Brennan, wanted very keenly to save the Medical School program. To find a more attractive terrain for doing battle, they made an end-run around Title VI, arguing that, whatever its language, it had no independent meaning itself. It meant in regard to race only what the Constitution meant. Thus, instead of having to parse the stingy and unyielding language of Title VI ("no person shall be subjected to discrimination . . on the ground of race"), the Brennan group could turn their creative energies to interpreting the broad and vague language of the Fourteenth Amendment ("no person shall be denied the equal protection of the laws"), which provided much more wiggle-room for justifying racial preferences. The Brennan group persuaded one other member, Justice Powell, to join them in their view of Title VI. But Powell didn't agree with their view of the Constitution. He argued that the Medical School's policy was unconstitutional and voted that Bakke must be admitted. His vote, added to the four votes of the Stevens group, meant that Allan Bakke won his case and that Powell got to write the opinion of the Court. The Brennan strategy didn't reap the fruit it intended.
Against the leanings of the Brennan group, who would distinguish between "benign" and "malign" uses of race and deal leniently with the former, Powell insisted that the Fourteenth Amendment's promise of "equal protection of the law" must mean the same thing for all, black and white alike. To paraphrase Powell:
The Constitution can tolerate no "two-class" theory of equal protection. There is no principled basis for deciding between classes that deserve special judicial attention and those that don't. To think otherwise would involve the Court in making all kinds of "political" decisions it is not competent to make. In expounding the Constitution, the Court's role is to discern "principles sufficiently absolute to give them roots throughout the community and continuity over significant periods of time, and to lift them above the pragmatic political judgments of a particular time and place . . . ."
What, then, was the practical meaning of a "sufficiently absolute" rendering of the principle of equal protection? It was this: when the decisions of state agents "touch upon an individual's race or ethnic background, he is entitled to a judicial determination that the burden he is asked to bear on that basis is precisely tailored to serve a compelling governmental interest."
Powell, with this standard in hand, then turned to look at the four reasons the Medical School offered for its special program: (i) to reduce "the historic deficit of traditionally disfavored minorities in medical schools and the medical profession;" (ii) to counter "the effects of societal discrimination;" (iii) to increase "the number of physicians who will practice in communities currently underserved;" and (iv) to obtain "the educational benefits that flow from an ethnically diverse student body." Did any or all of them specify a goal precisely tailored to serve a compelling governmental interest?
As to the first reason, Powell dismissed it out of hand.
If [the School's] purpose is to assure within its student body some specified percentage of a particular group merely because of its race or ethnic origin, such a preferential purpose must be rejected not as insubstantial but as facially invalid. Preferring members of any one group for no reason other than race or ethnic origin is discrimination for its own sake.
As to the second reason, Powell allowed it more force. A state has a legitimate interest in ameliorating the effects of past discrimination. Even so, contended Powell, the Court
has never approved a classification that aids persons perceived as members of relatively victimized groups at the expense of other innocent individuals in the absence of judicial, legislative, or administrative findings of constitutional or statutory violations.
And the Medical School
does not purport to have made, and is in no position to make, such findings. Its broad mission is education, not the formulation of any legislative policy or the adjudication of particular claims of illegality. . . . [I]solated segments of our vast governmental structures are not competent to make those decisions, at least in the absence of legislative mandates and legislatively determined criteria.
As to the third reason, Powell found it, too, insufficient. The Medical School provided no evidence that the best way it could contribute increased medical services to underserved communities was by employing a racially preferential admissions scheme. Indeed, the Medical School provided no evidence that its scheme would result in any benefits at all to such communities.
This left the fourth reason. Here Powell found merit. A university's interest in a diverse student body is legitimated by the First Amendment's implied protection of academic freedom. This Constitutional halo makes the interest "compelling." However, the Medical School's use of a racial and ethnic classification scheme was not "precisely tailored" to effect the School's interest in diversity, argued Powell.
The diversity that furthers a compelling state interest encompasses a far broader array of qualifications and characteristics of which racial or ethnic origin is but a single though important element. [The Medical School's] special admissions program, focused solely on ethnic diversity would hinder rather than further attainment of genuine diversity.
The diversity which provides an educational atmosphere "conducive to speculation, experiment and creation" feeds upon a nearly endless range of experiences, talents, and attributes that students might bring to campus. In reducing diversity to racial and ethnic quotas, the Medical School wholly misconceived this important educational interest.
In sum, although the last of the Medical School's four reasons encompassed a "compelling governmental interest," the School's special admissions program was not necessary to effect that interest. The special admissions program was unconstitutional. So concluded Justice Powell.
How, then, did the Bakke decision become the basis upon which universities across the land enacted -- or maintained -- racially preferential admissions policies?
If Powell had concluded with his assessment of the Medical School's four reasons, Bakke would have left university affirmative action in a precarious situation. However, when the California Supreme Court had earlier ruled on Bakke's lawsuit, it had ordered Bakke admitted and forbidden the Medical School to make any use of race or ethnicity in its admissions decisions. Powell thought this went too far. Given higher education's protected interest in "diversity," and given that a student's race or ethnicity might add to diversity just in the same way that her age, work and travel experiences, family background, special talents, fluency in several languages, athletic prowess, military service, and unusual accomplishments might add, Justice Powell vacated that portion of the California Supreme Court's order.
Then he added some dicta for guidance. If universities want to understand diversity and the role that race and ethnicity might play in achieving it, they should look to Harvard, proposed Powell, and he appended to his opinion a long statement of Harvard's diversity program. In such a program, Powell contended, racial or ethnic background might
be deemed a "plus" in a particular applicant's file, yet it does not insulate the individual from comparison with all other candidates for the available seats. . . . This kind of program treats each applicant as an individual in the admissions process. The applicant who loses out on the last available seat to another candidate receiving a "plus" on the basis of ethnic background will not have been foreclosed from all consideration for that seat simply because he was not the right color or had the wrong surname. It would mean only that his combined qualifications . . . did not outweigh those of the other applicant. His qualifications would have been weighed fairly and competitively, and he would have had no basis to complain of unequal treatment under the Fourteenth Amendment.
In these off-hand comments, universities saw a green light for pushing ahead aggressively with their affirmative action programs. Although Justice Powell's basic holding could not have been plainer (any system like the Medical School's that makes race a consistently decisive factor, or that assesses applications along two different tracks defined by race, or that uses numerical quotas fails Constitutional muster), by the mid-1980s universities across the land had in place systems of admissions and scholarship awards that exhibited some or all of these features. When the University of Maryland's Banneker scholarships -- awarded only to African American students -- were held in violation of the Constitution in 1974, the house of cards forming university affirmative action began to fall. In 1996, the Court of Appeals for the Fifth Circuit struck down the University of Texas Law School's admissions program, and in November of the same year the voters of California adopted Proposition 209, forbidding among other things all uses of race in the public university admissions system. In 1998, the voters of Washington enacted a similar measure. Also in 1998, the Court of Appeals for the First Circuit struck down a Boston plan assigning students to selective high schools by race. In 2001, two more schools saw their admissions programs invalidated: the University of Georgia and the University of Michigan Law School. In many of the cases, universities were using schemes that contravened Justice Powell's own holding; they were giving more than a "plus" to race. However, the Fifth Circuit Court in Hopwood threw a cloud even over Justice Powell's small window for affirmative action, boldly asserting that the Bakke holding was now dead as law and that race could not be used at all in admissions.
Given Justice Powell's singular opinion, supported by no one else on the Court, and given the drift of Supreme Court decisions on racial preferences since 1978, the Hopwood court was not outlandish, if a bit presumptuous, in declaring Powell's holding in Bakke dead. If the Supreme Court eventually confirms that Powell's holding is no longer the law, it is not likely either to exhume the arguments of Justice Brennan in Bakke. This would be a misfortune. They convey an interpretation of Constitutional equality that Justice Powell never fully engaged.
Brennan agreed with Powell that "equal protection" must mean the same thing -- that is, remain one rule -- whether applied to black or white. But the same rule applied to different circumstances need not yield the same results. Racial preferences created for different reasons and producing different outcomes need not all be judged in the same harsh, virtually fatal, manner.
Powell thought there was no principled way to distinguish "benign" from "malign" discrimination, but Brennan insisted there was. He argued that if the Court looked carefully at its past cases striking down Jim Crow laws, it would see the principle at work. What the Court found wrong in Jim Crow was that it served no purpose except to mark out and stigmatize one group of people as inferior. The "cardinal principle" operating in the Court's decisions condemned racial classifications "drawn on the presumption that one race is inferior to another" or that "put the weight of government behind racial hatred and separation." Brennan agreed with Powell that no public racial classification motivated by racial animus, no classification whose purpose is to stigmatize people with the "badge of inferiority," could withstand judicial scrutiny. However, the Medical School's policy, even if ill-advised or mistaken, reflected a public purpose far different from that found in Jim Crow. The policy ought not be treated as though it were cut from the same cloth.
Brennan granted that if a state adopted a racial classification for the purpose of humiliating whites, or stigmatizing Allan Bakke as inferior and confining him to second-class citizenship, that classification would be as odious as Jim Crow. But the Medical School's policy had neither this purpose nor this effect. Allan Bakke may have been upset and resentful at losing out under the special plan, but he wasn't "in any sense stamped as an inferior by the Medical School's rejection of him." Nor did his loss constitute a "pervasive injury," in the sense that wherever he went he would be treated as a "second-class citizen" because of his color.
In short, argued Brennan, the principle embedded in the Equal Protection Clause should be viewed as an anti-caste principle, a principle that uniformly and consistently rejects all public law whose purpose is to subject people to an inferior and degraded station in life, whether they are black or white. Of course, given the asymmetrical position of whites and blacks in our country, we are not likely to encounter laws that try to stigmatize whites as an inferior caste (much less succeed at it). But this merely shows that a principle applied to different circumstances produces different results. Given that the Medical School's program reflected an effort to undo the effects of a racial caste system long-enduring in America, it expressed a purpose of great social importance and should not be found Constitutionally infirm.
Powell never successfully engaged this way of reading "Constitutional equality." His insistence on clear, plain, unitary, absolute principle does not cut against the Brennan view. The issue between them is not the consistency and stringency of the principle but its content. Does the Constitution say, "The state cannot deliberately burden someone by race unless it passes an almost-always fatal test," or does it say, "The state cannot deliberately burden someone by race if its purpose is to create or maintain caste"?
If Powell did not answer Brennan, neither, in turn, did Brennan successfully address one of Powell's worries. Were the Brennan view to prevail, Powell feared, then people could be subjected without check to the half-baked plans of any public agency in the country determined to do its bit to "remedy" the effects of historical discrimination. People would have no protection against arbitrary and over-reaching "remedial" policies.
However, there was an opening offered in the Bakke opinion for protecting people against runaway preferences without outlawing programs like the Medical School's, a middle way never seized by either side. Recall that Powell dismissed the second reason offered by the Medical School -- that the state has an interest in ameliorating the effects of past discrimination -- by dismissing the School itself as neither competent nor authorized to make findings of past harm and adopt remedies for them. In both respects he was right. But on his own terms, then, he was required to give a respectful hearing to a body that was competent and authorized to inquire and legislate. Thus, suppose the legislature of California, after due deliberation and inquiry, had decided that the state's public universities should use special admissions plans like the Medical School's to temper in small part the evils attendant on California's own past history of discrimination. The legislature's interest in such ameliorative goals was conceded by Powell to be weighty. Moreover, limited and modest race-conscious policies would work in harmony with the legislature's aim, not at cross-purposes with it, as the Medical School's quota scheme worked at cross-purposes with achieving "diversity" (understood in Powell's sense). Why shouldn't Powell accede to the Medical School's admissions program under this hypothetical? Indeed, had he offered dicta on this point rather than on diversity, he might have moved the affirmative action debate into a more fruitful arena of debate. Letting state legislatures, and only state legislatures, decide on the make-up of state affirmative action programs would have left the decision in the hands of those who are representative of the people (as university faculties are not), competent to take account of a full range of relevant political factors (as courts are not), and authorized to legislate for the whole public good (as neither courts nor subordinate public agencies are). Of course, as subsequent political events in California and Washington indicate, some states might have foresworn any kind of preferential affirmative action. But other state legislatures might have explicitly authorized the kind of affirmative action admissions schemes their own public universities have carried on in a veiled, if not sub rosa, manner for two decades.
If we turn away from Constitutional exegesis, are we likely to find in political theory itself any principle of equality implying that every use of racial preferences in every circumstance works an intolerable injustice? There is reason to think not. To see why, consider John Rawls' theory of justice-as-fairness. For our purposes, what is striking about the theory is the division of labor it involves. Its very broadest principles of liberty and equality are themselves unable to single out proper micro-allocations of social benefits and burdens. This is not a defect; this is their nature. What they can do is structure roles and institutions which then create the social and legal machinery for assigning rights and responsibilities. Rawls' principles require a constitution to secure equality of citizenship to each member of society, but leaves most other matters to legislative judgment. Thus, law that in form and fact makes some people "second-class citizens" would be unconstitutional, clearly, but this limitation doesn't block asking people to bear unequal burdens for the common good, not even unequal burdens premised on their race or ethnicity. Nor does Rawls' principle of fair equality of opportunity block such burdens, either, for, while ordinarily discouraging selection based on race or ethnicity, it can itself be limited in the name of achieving greater equality of opportunity (a point conceded by Goldman).
Will putting aside Rawls and looking farther afield likely yield an understanding of general equality adamantly inhospitable to every use of preferences? The prospects seem dim. As Georgia Warnke has recently argued, a general notion of equality can argue as much for affirmative action (and the social inclusion it effects) as against it (and the racial non-neutrality it involves).
In the second wave of public controversy, spanning the 1990s, the affirmative action debate has narrowed both in its terms and focus. The focus is now race and ethnicity, because the central quarrel is now about university admissions. The terms are concomitantly constrained, with defenders of affirmative action emphasizing the virtues of diversity and opponents emphasizing the harms affirmative action imposes upon its very beneficiaries.
This second wave of public debate has not produced a flurry of philosophical articles like the first one. Indeed, in two 1990s collections edited by philosophers, Affirmative Action: Social Justice or Reverse Discrimination? and The Affirmative Action Debate, most of the entries by philosophical writers represent work from the 1970s, with only a smattering from the 1980s and 1990s. The debate of the 1990s has generated its share of print, but most of it has flowed from the pens of public intellectuals of one stripe or another or found home in the pages of law reviews. Nor has any of this work, by philosophers and nonphilosophers alike, departed from the templates established nearly thirty years ago.
That "diversity" has played a prominent role in the revived debates about preferences is no surprise, given that "diversity" was the legal hook proffered to universities in 1978. How does diversity support university affirmative action? In a widely circulated report in 1996, Neil Rudenstine, president of Harvard University, justified Harvard's commitment to diversity by invoking John Stuart Mill, who stressed the value of bringing "human beings in contact with persons dissimilar to themselves, and with modes of thought and action unlike those with which they are familiar." A diverse student body, argued Rudenstine, is as much an "educational resource" as a university's faculty, library, and laboratories.
This is the diversity spoken of by Justice Powell, a diversity of opinions, experiences, backgrounds, talents, aspirations, and perspectives represented on campus that fosters intense intellectual exchange, exploration, and growth among all students. Obviously, an individual's ethnicity, race, or gender can bear on this sort of diversity just as her being a devout Christian, tuba player, fluent speaker of Farsi, reserve military officer, former Peace Corps volunteer, champion swimmer, and self-taught auto mechanic can bear on it. Thus, a college seeking to admit a diverse entering class would not want to be utterly blind to race, ethnicity, or gender.
In recently defending itself in Gratz v. Bollinger against an attack on the way it admits students into its College of Literature, Science, and Arts, the University of Michigan relied heavily on the diversity argument, insisting that it had a compelling educational interest in achieving racial and ethnic diversity. It put into evidence findings by one of its psychology professors, Patricia Gurin, showing that
students learn better in a diverse educational environment, and they are better prepared to become active participants in our pluralistic, democratic society once they leave such a setting. . . . [S]tudents who experienced the most racial and ethnic diversity in classroom settings and in informal interactions with peers showed the greatest engagement in active thinking processes, growth in intellectual engagement and motivation, and growth in intellectual and academic skills.
These findings might seem dispositive. Racial and ethnic diversity furthers good education. But how much so? Is such diversity literally compelling or merely legally so. In defending their affirmative action policies, universities must be careful not to commit themselves to claims that look dubious on second thought.
For example, is the University of Michigan contending that, without a steady 8 or 9 percent representation of African American undergraduates on campus, it wouldn't be able to offer an education adequately developing its students' intellectual skills and civic commitments? If the University makes this argument, does it then imply that students attending Morehouse College or Florida A&M University cannot receive excellent educations, intellectually and civically? After all, these campuses are not at all racially and ethnically diverse. Indeed, Morehouse is lacking in gender diversity as well, since it is a college for men.
Once we begin to attend to the extraordinary variety among institutions of higher education in America, we might conclude that no single pattern of diversity within a school is a sine qua non for students' intellectual growth and civic development. Having 8 or 9 percent African American undergraduates on campus may be an educational desideratum but not an imperative.
In fact, it is clear enough that, had Patricia Gurin's findings come out differently, the University of Michigan was not about to relax its target of 8 or 9 percent African American undergraduates. Although racial and ethnic diversity at Ann Arbor might enrich students' educational experiences, the main reason the University of Michigan strives for a reasonable representation of minorities on campus is because of the way it conceives of its mission: to prepare Michigan's future leaders.
The argument is straightforward:
This is the "Michigan Mandate." Racial and ethnic diversity aren't incidental contributors to a distinct academic mission; they are part of the mission of the University, just as educating young people from Michigan is part of the mission.
Likewise, the principal aim of the elite universities studied by William Bowen and Derek Bok in The Shape of the River: Long-Term Consequences of Considering Race in College and University Admissions was not, through vigorous affirmative action, to enhance the liberal learning of their students (although they welcomed this gain for all students). Their main motive for assuring that the numbers of blacks on their campuses would be more than token derived from their self-conceptions as institutions training individuals who would some day take up leadership roles in the professions, arts, science, education, politics, and government. The nation, they believe, will be stronger and more just with a leadership reflecting a broader racial and ethnic profile than it does now (and than it did twenty-five years ago).
But at what cost? Stephan and Abigail Thernstrom have argued that the cost is high and falls on the very persons affirmative action is supposed to benefit. Under-prepared blacks are thrown into academic environments where they cannot compete. In the Thernstroms' view, race-blind admissions policies would result in a desirable "cascading," with African American students ending up at colleges and universities where the academic credentials of entering students matches their own. In their own study, Bowen and Bok show that cascading isn't necessarily a valuable phenomenon. In fact, at the schools they studied, the better the institution a student entered, whatever his academic credentials, the more likely he was to graduate and go on to further education and earn a good income.
Of course, the select schools Bowen and Bok studied may be quite unrepresentative of the full range of colleges and universities that resort to racial preferences, and the cost-benefit ratio that holds for these schools may not hold for the rest. Nor does cascading in general look like a bad thing, if James Traub's portrait of the University of California system after Proposition 209 indicates a generalizable effect.
Although the full facts about affirmative action in the university remain contentious and under debate, the data provided by Bowen and Bok settle at least one matter. Switching to class-based affirmative action would not be a proxy for race-based affirmative action. At every income level, white students possess better grades and SAT scores than blacks at that same level. Giving preference by social class would result, thus, in disproportionately more whites than blacks entering selective universities.
The affirmative action debate throws up many ironies but one in particular should be noted. From the time in 1973 when Judith Jarvis Thomson conjectured that it was "not entirely inappropriate" that white males bear the costs of the community's "making amends" to blacks and women through preferential affirmative action, the affirmative action debate has been distracted by intense quarrels over who deserves what. Do the beneficiaries of affirmative action deserve their benefits? Do the losers deserve their loss?
Christopher Edley, the White House assistant put in charge of President Clinton's review of affirmative action policy in 1994-95, speaks of how, during the long sessions he and his co-workers put in around the conference table, the discussion of affirmative action kept circling back to the "coal miner's son" question.
Imagine a college admissions committee trying to decide between the white [son] of an Appalachian coal miner's family and the African American son of a successful Pittsburgh neurosurgeon. Why should the black applicant get preference over the white applicant?
Why, indeed? This is a hard question if one defends affirmative action in terms of compensatory or distributive justice. If directly doing justice is what affirmative action is about, then its mechanisms must be adjusted as best they can to reward individual desert and true merit. The "coal miner's son" example is meant to throw desert in the defender's face: here is affirmative action at work thwarting desert, for surely the coal miner's son -- from the hard scrabble of Harlan County, say -- has lived with far less advantage than the neurosurgeon's son who, we may suppose, has reaped all the advantages of his father's (or mother's) standing. Why should the latter get a preference?
A defender might answer in the way that Charles Lawrence and Mari Matsuda do: "All the talk about class, the endless citings of the poor white male from Appalachia, cannot avoid the reality of race and gender privilege." White privilege means that racial preferences really do balance the scales. Male privilege means that gender preferences really do make selections fairer. There must be no concession: in every case the loser in affirmative action is not the more deserving.
Even Justice Brennan tried his hand at this argument, writing in Bakke:
If it was reasonable to conclude -- as we hold that it was -- that the failure of minorities to qualify for admission at Davis under regular procedures was due principally to the effects of past discrimination, then there is a reasonable likelihood that, but for pervasive racial discrimination, . . . [Bakke] would have failed to qualify for admission even in the absence of Davis' special admissions program.
Counterfactually, Bakke was not denied anything to which he had moral claim in the first place.
Just as Mary Anne Warren and James Rachels in the 1970s thought that the losers under affirmative action were losing only illicit privileges, and the gainers merely gaining what should have been theirs to start with, so Michel Rosenfeld in the 1990s, in his extended "dialogic" defense of affirmative action, echoed the same thought:
Although affirmative action treats innocent white males unequally, it need not deprive them of any genuine equal opportunity rights. Provided an affirmative action plan is precisely tailored to redress the losses in prospects of success [by blacks and women] attributable to racism and sexism, it only deprives innocent white males of the corresponding undeserved increases in their prospects of success . . . . [R]emedial affirmative action does not take away from innocent white males anything that they have rightfully earned or that they should be entitled to keep.
But preferential programs that give blanket preferences by race or gender are hardly precisely tailored to match desert and reward since, as Lawrence and Matsuda acknowledge, the white male "privilege" is "statistical." Yet it is individuals, not statistical averages, who gain or lose in the admissions committee decisions and employment office selections.
More pointedly, why the persistence of this obdurate strategy of defense when real-world affirmative action has had no truck with it? The affirmative action programs legitimated under the Civil Rights Act, in both their nonpreferential and preferential forms, had -- and have -- a specific aim: to change institutions so that they can meet the nondiscrimination mandate of the Act. Selection by race or gender was -- and is -- a means to such change. To the extent that such selection also compensated individuals for past wrongs or put people in places they really deserved, these are incidental by-products of a process aimed at something else.
Similarly, when the Medical School offered four reasons in defense of the special admissions program that left Bakke on the outside, none of these reasons said anything about matching admissions and desert. The criteria of the special admissions program -- race and ethnicity -- were instruments to further ends: integrating the classroom, the profession, and the delivery of medical services; and breaking the chain of self-reproducing societal discrimination. If the neurosurgeon's son because of his race can advance each of these goals and the coal miner's son can not, then the selection decision is easy: pick the black neurosurgeon's son (however advantaged he may have been) over the white coal miner's son (even were he the most deserving creature imaginable). The aims of real-world affirmative action make race and ethnicity (and sometimes gender) salient, not personal desert or merit.
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First published: December 28, 2001
Content last modified: December 28, 2001