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We can now define several critical notions:
In putting forward this theory, the actualist takes herself to be replacing an obscure distinction between two modes of being -- possible existence and actual existence -- with an intelligible distinction. This distinction is replaced by an allegedly clear distinction between two kinds of existing states of affairs -- those that obtain and those that don't). That the latter distinction is more intelligible than the former ones is often just assumed by the actualist without argument. This invites the question whether there are cogent arguments for this assumption. However, again, we will not pursue this question here.
Furthermore, in putting forward this theory, the actualist has not invoked any objects which have such modal properties as being a possible million carat diamond, being a possible talking donkey, being a possible Alien, etc. The worlds of the actualist do in fact have modal properties and the fact that they do is essential for them to do the work they have to do in the theory. A possible world is a state of affairs that could be such that it includes all and only states of affairs that obtain. Postulating objects with modal properties such as this seems less objectionable to the actualist than postulating objects with the modal properties described at the beginning of this paragraph. This of course invites a certain question, namely, just why is it less objectionable to have objects with the latter modal properties than the former one. But, again, we will not pursue this question here.
This latter point about the actualist theory of worlds brings us to the second step of their treatment of modality, namely, how to analyze ordinary modal claims that seem to require such possible individuals as possible million carat diamonds, possible talking donkeys, possible Aliens, etc. For the remainder of this essay, then, we assume that some actualist theory of worlds is viable and therefore concentrate our energies solely on the problems that arise in connection possible individuals rather than possible worlds.
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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000