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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Actualism

Three Types of Possibilism

A possibilist is someone who believes that there are things that are not actual. There are two ways to understand this claim. On the first, the possibilist distinguishes what there is from what exists, or is actual, and argues that the latter comprises a relatively small portion of the former. On this view, then, actual things exhibit a certain intrinsic, ontological property --- existence, or actuality --- which things that merely are happen to lack, things like Aliens, people that were never born, and so on. Such things could have exhibited this property, of course, and indeed would have had things been different, but, as it happens, they simply do not. This, then, on the first understanding of possibilism, is what the possibilist means when she says that there are things that are not actual.

The second way of understanding possibilism can be traced back to Quine [1948], who insisted that there is no coherent distinction between what there is and what exists. Thus, for Quine, possibilism, as understood in the previous paragraph, is straightforwardly inconsistent. For to say ‘there are things that don't exist’ would simply be to say ‘there exist things that don't exist’. He left a loophole, however, that allows a possibilist to skirt Quine's charge. Rather than distinguishing being from existence, the possibilist can agree with Quine that they are identical: everything there is exists. However, the possibilist will insist, not everything that exists is actual. To say that there are things that are not actual, then, is to say that there exist things that fail to be actual.

One might charge that this second variety of possibilist is playing mere word games: she has retained the metaphysics of classical possibilism, but has simply renamed being as ‘existence’ and existence as ‘actuality’. And indeed, that is perhaps the most natural way of construing the move -- the possibilist agrees to cede Quine's point about the comprehensiveness of the meaning of ‘existence’. The possibilist's rejoinder is that Quine's point is no threat to the coherence of a possibilist metaphysics.

Quine, of course, would likely reply that the wedge driven by this new variety of possibilism between existence and actuality is no more legitimate than the one formerly driven between being and existence. Thus, for Quine, the possibilist has not really addressed the original objection, which challenges the possibilist's introduction of two modes of being. The possibilist has simply replaced two modes of being with two modes of existence --- actual existence and possible existence. Again, though, the possibilist is not without a reply: she can simply deny that actuality is any sort of ontological mode. It's just a property that some things have, and other things lack. The debate at this point seems a stalemate.

There is one final notable form of possibilism that is truer in spirit to Quine's original objection, namely, David Lewis's. As with the second form of possibilism just discussed, on Lewis's view, being and existence coincide; there is no special ontological property, no distinct mode of being, that separates merely possible objects from actual ones. Moreover, as with the second form, actuality does not coincide with existence. However, unlike the second form, actuality is not any sort of intrinsic ontological property. Indeed, actuality is not really a property at all, but a relation: x is actual relative to y just in case x and y occupy the same possible world; or, equivalently, just in case they are spatially or temporally related to one another. (x is spatially related to y just in case x and y occupy the same space or some distance separates them. Similarly, x is temporally related to y just in case x and y exist at exactly the same times or one existed at some time before or after the other.) On this view, then, to say that there are things that are not actual is simply to say that there are things that occupy other worlds than ours, things that exist, in a fully-fledged sense, but which are just spatially and temporally unrelated to us.

Lewis proposes a well-known, and natural, semantic corollary to this view about actuality, namely, that the word ‘actual’ is an indexical: its reference on any given occasion of utterance, like that of ‘I’, ‘now’, etc., is essentially determined by the context of the utterance, and in particular, the world in which the utterance occurs. Thus, what makes "Clinton is actual" (or, somewhat more naturally, "Clinton actually exists") true when I utter it is not some intrinsic property of Clinton --- actuality --- but rather simply the fact that he occupies the same world as the speaker, i.e., me.

As with the second version of possibilism, then, Lewis acknowledges the comprehensive character of existence, but without introducing any special primitive property, or existential mode, of actuality. Either way, modern day possibilists are able to follow Quine in rejecting the distinction between being and existence and still make sense of both possibilism and modality generally.

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Copyright © 2000 by
Christopher Menzel

First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000