This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Actualism


1. Some good sources for actualism are the following: Adams [1974], Plantinga [1976], Kaplan [1975], Loux [1979], and Tomberlin and van Inwagen [1985].

2. We assume here that, as with all natural kinds, being an Alien is an essential property of anything that has it.

3. A potential actualist move is worth addressing here. One might argue that, in fact, there is a straightforward actualist account of the possibility of Aliens. A widely-accepted contemporary metaphysical belief is that, for every set of objects, there exists the mereological sum consisting of exactly those objects. Given this, assuming that Aliens are composed of the same basic atomic stuff that we are, there are surely actual merological sums of atoms that are possible Aliens, i.e., that could have been Aliens if only they'd been properly arranged. Hence, there is no need to postulate possibilia to provide a semantics for claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’. However, this objection misses the point. The general intuition that we are attempting to isolate with the Alien example is that

(*) There could have been things other than the things that actually exist.
All that the actualist move just noted succeeds in showing is that perhaps the Alien example doesn't entail (*). But it does not succeed in accounting for the intuition that (*) is true. For suppose we accept the proposed mereological gambit, i.e., that certain mereological sums of actual atoms could have been Aliens, or instances of any other uninstantiated natural kind. Is it not still the case that there could have been different atoms (or quarks or whatever basic building blocks you choose) than there are in fact? Indeed, is it not logically possible that the universe could have been composed of entirely different stuff altogether? If so, then the actualist still needs to account for (*).

It should also be noted that the mereological gambit itself is dubious. Its basic premise -- that any collection of atoms constitutes a further physical object -- is far from uncontroversial. More seriously, it seems quite clear that no instance of a physical natural kind is identical with any given mereological sum of atoms, as physical bodies are constituted by many different sums of atoms across time as those bodies change. Perhaps, however, the actualist could come up with some more sophisticated mereological construct C to avoid this objection. Still, it seems, there are problems. For intuitively, it seems that the same C, structured one way, could have been an instance of one kind, and structured another, could have been an instance of a different kind. But then it seems to follow from the "modal transitivity" of identity (i.e., the principle:

xy(y=x z(x=z y=z)))
that if a member of a natural kind is literally identical with a C, then it is possible that an instance of a given kind could have been an instance of a very different kind. But this conflicts with strong intuitions about the essentiality of kind membership. So even if the actualist's hypothetical construct C were plausible, rather than taking Cs to be actualist surrogates for possible Aliens (or whatever), it would be at least equally reasonable to claim that certain Cs are only possibly co-located with, or possibly constitutive of, but not possibly identical with, an Alien. For, in that case, all that follows is that the same C might have been co-located with (or constitutive of) instances of very different natural kinds, and intuitions about the essentiality of kind membership are preserved.

4. Unfortunately, for reasons rooted ultimately in the monumental work of Gödel [1931], a first-order logic cannot provide a completely decidable mechanism for determining validity. More exactly, while it is true that, if a formula is valid, one can eventually find a proof of it in the logic, there is in general no proof theoretic way to determine that a formula is invalid.

5. Adams [1974], p. 204. This is equivalent to the following, simpler definition: a world story is a set s of propositions such that it is possible that, for all propositions p, s contains p if and only if p is true. This account of world stories is significantly more accessible than the later account in Adams [1981]. The added subtleties of the later account are introduced to enable it to serve as a semantics for a broader range of modal statements, particular those involving contingent propositions, notably propositions about possible nonexistence. However, for the purposes of the present article, these subtleties add unnecessary complexity, as I believe that the 1981 account ultimately falls prey to essentially the same objections that are raised here against the earlier account.

6. McMichael does not actually use the idea of inclusion relative to an argument place. Rather, I have introduced it to simplify the presentation of the theory. It is an equivalent mechanism and so has no impact on the theory's content. McMichael's own account relies on an elegant, but conceptually more challenging permutation mechanism that shuffles argument places in relations.

7. For the sake of simplicity, we ignore temporal qualifications in these examples that would be needed in a fully accurate account, e.g., being condemned to death as an adult.

8. As indicated, order matters in our representation of relations: the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is distinct from the binary role that Johnson bears to Boswell, the latter, of course, being the converse of the former.

9. Things are a bit more subtle than this, for to have an intended* model, one also needs to do a little more to reflect the modal facts expressed by means of iterated modalities. See Menzel (1990) for details.

Copyright © 2000 by
Christopher Menzel

First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000