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Notes to Actualism

2. We assume here that, as with all natural kinds, being an Alien is an essential property of anything that has it.

3.
A potential actualist move is worth addressing here. One might
argue that, in fact, there is a straightforward actualist account of
the possibility of Aliens. A widely-accepted contemporary
metaphysical belief is that, for every set of objects, there exists
the mereological sum consisting of exactly those objects. Given
this, assuming that Aliens are composed of the same basic atomic
stuff that we are, there are surely actual merological sums of atoms
that are possible Aliens, i.e., that *could* have been Aliens if
only they'd been properly arranged. Hence, there is no need to
postulate possibilia to provide a semantics for claims like ‘It is
possible that there are Aliens’. However, this objection misses the
point. The general intuition that we are attempting to isolate with
the Alien example is that

(*)All that the actualist move just noted succeeds in showing is that perhaps the Alien example doesn't entail (*). But it does not succeed in accounting for the intuition that (*) is true. For suppose we accept the proposed mereological gambit, i.e., that certain mereological sums of actual atoms could have been Aliens, or instances of any other uninstantiated natural kind. Is it not still the case that there could have beenThere could have been things other than the things that actually exist.

It should also be noted that the mereological gambit itself is
dubious. Its basic premise -- that any collection of atoms
constitutes a further physical object -- is far from uncontroversial.
More seriously, it seems quite clear that no instance of a physical
natural kind *is* identical with any given mereological sum of
atoms, as physical bodies are constituted by many different sums of
atoms across time as those bodies change. Perhaps, however, the
actualist could come up with some more sophisticated mereological
construct C to avoid this objection. Still, it seems, there are
problems. For intuitively, it seems that the same C, structured one
way, could have been an instance of one kind, and structured another,
could have been an instance of a different kind. But then it seems
to follow from the "modal transitivity" of identity (i.e., the
principle:

that if a member of a natural kind is literally identical with a C, then it is possible that an instance of a given kind could have been an instance of a very different kind. But this conflicts with strong intuitions about the essentiality of kind membership. So even if the actualist's hypothetical construct C were plausible, rather than taking Cs to be actualist surrogates for possible Aliens (or whatever), it would be at least equally reasonable to claim that certain Cs are only possiblyxy(y=xz(x=zy=z)))

4.
Unfortunately, for reasons rooted ultimately in the monumental work
of Gödel [1931], a first-order logic cannot provide a completely
*decidable* mechanism for determining validity. More exactly,
while it is true that, if a formula is valid, one can eventually find
a proof of it in the logic, there is in general no proof theoretic
way to determine that a formula is *invalid*.

5.
Adams [1974], p. 204. This is equivalent to the following, simpler
definition: a world story is a set **s** of propositions such that
it is possible that, for all propositions **p**, **s** contains
**p** if and only if **p** is true. This account of world
stories is significantly more accessible than the later account in
Adams [1981]. The added subtleties of the later account are
introduced to enable it to serve as a semantics for a broader range
of modal statements, particular those involving contingent
propositions, notably propositions about possible nonexistence.
However, for the purposes of the present article, these subtleties
add unnecessary complexity, as I believe that the 1981 account
ultimately falls prey to essentially the same objections that are
raised here against the earlier account.

6. McMichael does not actually use the idea of inclusion relative to an argument place. Rather, I have introduced it to simplify the presentation of the theory. It is an equivalent mechanism and so has no impact on the theory's content. McMichael's own account relies on an elegant, but conceptually more challenging permutation mechanism that shuffles argument places in relations.

7.
For the sake of simplicity, we ignore temporal qualifications in
these examples that would be needed in a fully accurate account,
e.g., **being condemned to death as an adult**.

8. As indicated, order matters in our representation of relations: the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is distinct from the binary role that Johnson bears to Boswell, the latter, of course, being the converse of the former.

9.
Things are a bit more subtle than this, for to have an intended*
model, one also needs to do a little more to reflect the modal facts
expressed by means of iterated modalities. See Menzel (1990) for
details.

Christopher Menzel

*First published: June 16, 2000*

*Content last modified: June 16, 2000*