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A property P is essential to an individual x if and only if it is not possible that x exist and fail to exemplify P.
A property E is an individual essence of an individual x if and only if (i) E is essential to x and (ii) necessarily, for all individuals y, y exemplifies E if and only if y = x. Hence, E is an individual essence, simpliciter, if and only if it is possible that there be an individual x such that P is an individual essence of x.
Note that, by the above definition, an individual could have several individual essences.
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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000