####
Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Actualism

## Plantinga's Definition of an Individual Essence

**Essential Properties**
A property *P* is *essential to* an individual *x*
if and only if it is not possible that *x* exist and fail to
exemplify *P*.

**Individual Essences**

A property *E* is an *individual essence of* an
individual *x* if and only if (i) *E* is essential to
*x* and (ii) necessarily, for all individuals *y*, *y*
exemplifies *E* if and only if *y* = *x*. Hence,
*E* is an individual essence, simpliciter, if and only if it is
possible that there be an individual *x* such that *P* is
an individual essence of *x*.

Note that, by the above definition, an individual could have several
individual essences.

Copyright © 2000 by

Christopher Menzel

*cmenzel@tamu.edu*
Return to Actualism

*First published: June 16, 2000*

*Content last modified: June 16, 2000*