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To answer this question, a philosopher should try to identify the
special features of the world that are responsible for the truth of
claims about what could have been been the case. One group of
philosophers, the *possibilists*, offer the following answer:
‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is true because there are in
fact individuals that could have been Aliens. By hypothesis, however,
such individuals are simply possible and not actual. No actually
existing thing could possibly have been an Alien. Hence, the truth
of ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is, according to
possibilism, grounded in the fact that there are
possible-but-nonactual Aliens, i.e., things that are not actual but
which could have been, and such that, moreover, if they had been
actual, they would have been Aliens.

Actualists reject this answer; they deny that there are any
nonactual individuals. Actualism is the philosophical position that
everything there is -- everything that can be said to exist in any
sense -- is *actual*. Put another way, actualism denies that
there is any kind of being beyond actuality; to be is to be
actual. Actualism therefore stands in stark contrast to possibilism,
which, as we've seen, takes the things there are to include possible
but non-actual objects.

Of course, actualists will agree that there could have been Aliens. Actualism, therefore, can be thought of as the metaphysical theory that attempts to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to any nonactual objects whatsoever. What makes actualism so philosophically interesting, is that there is no obviously correct way to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to possible but nonactual objects. In the rest of this article, we will lay out the various attempts to do so in some detail and assess their effectiveness.

- §1: The Possibilist Challenge to Actualism
- §2: The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML)
- §3: Kripke's System
- §4: Is Kripke's System Actualist?
- §5: Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Possibilism is the denial of this thesis and there are various forms of possibilism that correspond to the various ways in which one can deny Thesis (A). (This is explained in more detail in the supplementary document: Three Types of Possibilism.)

(A) Everything that exists (i.e., everything there is) is actual.

*The possibilist challenge* to actualism is to give an analysis
of our ordinary modal beliefs which is consistent with Thesis (A),
i.e., which doesn't appeal to possible but nonactual objects. There
are two central aspects to the possibilist challenge: the challenge
of possible worlds, and the challenge of possible objects. The
latter will be the central focus of this article, but, for the sake
of completeness, we begin with a brief discussion of the former.

(a) The statement ‘It is necessary thatNotice that it is a consequence of analysis (b) that true claims asserting a possibility imply the existence of possible worlds.p’ (‘p’) is true just in casepis true in all possible worlds.(b) The statement ‘It is possible that

p’ (‘p’) is true just in casepis true in some possible world.

On the face of it, then, the possible worlds analysis of basic modal statements just sketched appears to entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, and hence appears directly to contradict Thesis (A). Consequently, actualists either have to try to develop a semantics for modal statements in terms that do not entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, or at least to provide an account of possible worlds on which this consequence is rendered metaphysically innocuous.

The power of the possible worlds semantics -- and the distinct lack
of any persuasive alternatives -- is very attractive to many
actualists, and they are loathe to give it up (so long, of course, as
they do not have to abandon actualism). Consequently, actualists
typically grasp the second horn of the above dilemma and adopt some
sort of actualistically acceptable, "sanitized" version of this
theory on which possible worlds are conceived as theoretical
*abstract* objects which actually exist. Many such theories of
abstractly-conceived worlds have been developed, some with better
success than others (see, for example, Plantinga [1974] and [1976],
Chisholm [1976], Fine [1977], Adams, [1974], van Inwagen [1986], or
Zalta [1983] and [1993]). Some take worlds to be maximal possible
states of affairs, others take them to be maximal possible properties
or propositions, still others treat them as maximal consistent sets
of some sort, and yet others treat them as part of a more general
theory of abstract objects. For purposes here, it will serve well
enough just to assume some generic version of this view on which such
abstractly conceived worlds can perform their theoretical tasks in
virtue of certain actualistically unobjectionable modal properties.
A detailed version of such an account, and some of its philosophical
ramifications, can be found in the supplementary document on
An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds.

Now consider the modal claim ‘There could have been Aliens’. It is
natural to regiment this claim as "It is possible that there exists
an *x* such that *x* is an Alien", which is typically
formalized as follows:

Now, if we deploy some acceptable theory of possible worlds, we know that sentence (1) is true if and only if:

(1) xAx.

But, it is a fact about the logic of the quantifier ‘there exists’ that such quantifiers ‘commute’ with one another. In other words, (2) implies (3):

(2) There exists a possible world wand there exists an individualxsuch thatxis an Alien atw.

So the truth conditions of (1) imply (3). But if (3) is true, then so is the ordinary modal claim ‘Something is possibly an Alien’, i.e.,

(3) There exists an individual xand there exists a possible worldwsuch thatxis an Alien atw.

for which (3) provides the truth conditions. Thus, given the simplest logic concerning modal and quantifier claims, (1) implies (4). In other words, the simplest quantified modal logic tells us that (5) implies (6):

(4) xAx

The problem for the second step of the actualist treatment of modality may now be stated more precisely, namely, Thesis (A) is inconsistent with (6). Thesis (A) asserts that everything actually exists. But (6) seems to assert the existence of a possible Alien. There seem to be no candidates among the actually existing individuals which we might plausibly identify as a possible Alien.

(5) It is possible that there exists an xsuch thatxis an Alien.(6) There exists an xsuch that it is possible thatxis an Alien.

Since it seems reasonable to want to hang on to such ordinary modal beliefs as (5), there is an apparent incompatibility between the simplest quantified modal logic and actualism. This is only the tip of the iceberg, however, for the problem described in the previous paragraph resurfaces each time we ‘nest’ or ‘iterate’ modalities. Consider, for example, the following sentences:

Such sentences seems to be representable as follows:

(7) The Pope (i.e., Karol Wojtyla) could have had a son who could have become a priest. (8) There could be a planet disturbing the orbit of Pluto and it could have a period of nyears.

These cases pose a serious problem for any actualist metaphysics. Even if we assume that actualists can successfully develop a metaphysics and logic that explain the truth of the first occurrence of ‘could’ in (7) and (8), respectively, a serious question arises concerning the second occurrence. The simplest logic of the second occurrence of the "nested" modal operator in (9) and (10) would suggest that it describes a modal fact about a possible individual -- a possible son of the pope in (9), and a possible planet disturbing the orbit of Pluto in (10). (9) seems to assert that a possible son of the pope has the modal property of

(9) x(Sxp&Px)(10) x(Lx&Dxp&Pxn)

The remaining sections of this essay, therefore, contain the following material. In Section §2, we describe, in a precise way, both the characteristics of the simplest quantified modal logic and its controversial theorems. (As we acquire more sophisticated logical tools, we will revisit some of the examples already discussed; the redescription of these examples in more sophisticated logical terms may prove to be instructive.) We also show why each of the controversial theorems is objectionable from the standpoint of actualism. In Section §3, we outline a modal system developed by Saul Kripke that appears to be consistent with Thesis (A). However, in Section §4, we'll discover that Kripke's system introduces special problems of its own. Finally, in Section §5, we discuss the various attempts actualists have made to work within a Kripke-style framework to solve these problems and to find a metaphysical theory of necessity and possibility which is consistent with Thesis (A). However, we will also examine the attempts of some actualists who have recently discovered a new interpretation of the simplest quantified modal logic which is consistent with Thesis (A).

The simplest semantics for the
language **L** defines a class of interpretations having two
distinguishing features: (1) each interpretation **I** in the
class has just two, mutually exclusive domains--a nonempty domain of
possible worlds (which includes a distinguished "actual world"
**w _{0}**) and a nonempty domain of individuals, and (2)
given any individuals

The semantic notion
‘ is true (under interpretation **I** and
assignment **f**) at world **w**’
(‘true_{I,f} at **w**’) is then defined
recursively for all of the formulas of the language. The three mosts
important parts of this definition for quantified modal logic are the
clauses for atomic, quantified, and modal formulas. Here are examples
of each:

- The open, atomic formula ‘
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case**I**specifies that ‘*P*’ applies to**d**_{I}_{,f}(*x*) at**w**. - The quantified formula
‘
*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individuals**a**, ‘*Px’*is true_{I,f[x,a]}at**w**, where**f**[*x*,**a**] is**f**if**f**(*x*) =**a**, and otherwise is just like**f**except that it assigns**a**to*x*instead of**f**(*x*). (A little less formally, ‘*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individuals**a**, the predicate ‘*P*’ applies to**a**at**w**.) - The open, modal formula
‘
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case for every possible world**w**, ‘*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**.

The simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) systematizes the
logically true sentences of **L** relative to the simplest
semantics. SQML combines the logical axioms and rules of inference
from classical propositional logic, classical first-order
quantification theory, the logic of identity, and S5 modal logic. We
presuppose here that the laws of classical first-order logic with
identity are known. The system S5 (aka KT5) adds three axioms to
classical first-order logic with identity--the K axiom, the T axiom,
and the 5 axiom (see below)--and adds the Rule of Necessitation (RN)
(which states that whenever
is a theorem, so is
). Each of the logical axioms
of the resulting SQML is true in every interpretation in the class
described in the previous paragraph. Moreover, the rules of inference
‘preserve truth’ (and preserve logical truth). That is, the rules of
inference permit one to infer only (logical) truths from any set of
premises consisting solely of (logical) truths. Notice that open
formulas are assertible as axioms and provable as theorems in
SQML. For convenience, we reproduce these in the supplementary
document
The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic.
Familiarity with this logic will be presupposed in what follows.

The problem that SQML poses for actualist philosophers is that whereas all of the logical axioms appear to be true, some of the logical consequences of these axioms appear to be false. Consider first the fact that the new modal axioms added by SQML to classical first-order logic, i.e., the K, T, and 5 axioms, all seem true. The K axiom asserts that if a conditional is necessary, then if the antecedent is necessary, so is the consequent:

K axiom: () ()It is easy to see that this is true in every interpretation of the class of simplest interpretations: if a conditional is true in every possible world and the antecedent of the conditional is true in every world, then the consequent of the conditional is true in every world.

The ‘T’ axiom asserts that a formula true in every possible world is simply true:

T axiom:Clearly, this is true in all interpretations--if a sentence is true in every possible world, it is true in the distinguished actual world.

The ‘5’ axiom asserts that if a formula is possible, then it is necessarily the case that it is possible:

5 axiom:It is not hard to see that this is logically true. If a formula is true in some possible world, then from the point of view of every possible world, the formula is true in some possible world. That is, if a formula is true at some possible world, then at every possible world, there is some possible world where the formula is true. (The formal validity of the 5 Axiom is proved in the supplementary document The 5 Axiom is Logically True.)

BF, NE, and CBF are, respectively, the Barcan Formula, Necessary Existence, and the Converse Barcan Formula. It is reasonably straightforward to establish that NE and the instances of BF and CBF are all logically true and that they are all derivable from the axioms and rules of SQML. The proofs of these claims are provided in following supplementary documents:

BF: xxNE: xy y=xCBF: xx

The Barcan Formula is Logically TrueWe also show how to use the axioms and rules of SQML in the following documents:

The ‘Necessary Existence’ Principle is Logically True

The Converse Barcan Formula is Logically True

Proof of the Barcan Formula in S5Before we turn to the discussion of why actualists find BF, NE, and CBF objectionable, there are two minor details to attend to. The first is that the Barcan Formula is often discussed in the following equivalent form (indeed, this was the formulation that played a role in our discussion in the first section of the present essay):

Proof of ‘Necessary Existence’ in S5

Proof of Converse Barcan Formula in S5

(In the supplementary document, Proof of Barcan Formula Equivalent, we show that this statement is equivalent to BF.) Referring back to our Alien example, then, BF in this form, where is ‘xx

... BF requires thatthere existssomething that is possiblyb's sister. Sincebhas no sisters, which existing object is it that is possiblyb's sister? Some actualists, notably Ruth Marcus [1986], might defend BF by pointing to an existing woman (possibly one closely related tob) and suggesting that she is the thing which both exists and which is possiblyb's sister. But the great majority of actualists don't accept this idea, for they subscribe to certain essentialist views about the nature of objects. For example, they believe that women who aren'tb's sister could not have been (in a metaphysical sense)b's sister. This is a fact about their very nature, one concerning their origins. ... Since there seems to be noactually existingthing which is possiblyb's sister, they conclude BF is false. We think the essentialist intuitions leading to this conclusion are not unreasonable, and so understand why these actualists take BF to be false. Indeed, it seems that BF, in general, is incompatible with the intuition that there might have been something distinct from every actual thing. It is hard to see how that intuition could be compatible with a principle which seems to require that every possibility be grounded in something that exists. This is further evidence actualists have against the acceptability of BF. But since they still want to make sense of modal discourse in terms of possible world semantics, they reject the Barcan formula as having unacceptable consequences, and search for a modal semantics on which it is not valid.

Consider next NE. For actualists, this explicitly says that for any
object *x*, necessarily something exists that is identical with
*x*. Now most actualists accept the following definition of
what it is for an object to exist:

Given this definition, NE says that everything necessarily exists. (hence our abbreviation ‘NE’). Prior in [1957] was especially concerned by this, pointing out that classical quantified modal logic was "haunted by the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily." Note that NE applies even to those objects not named by a constant of the language. These consequences run counter to our ordinary (modal) intuitions. They are not inconsistent with Thesis (A), but are instead inconsistent with the reasonable belief that some objects might not have existed. Actualists see this as an additional and independent reason to abandon SQML.x exists=_{df}y(y = x)

Another problem with NE is that it leads to an even stronger result. By applying the Rule of Generalization and then the Rule of Necessitation to NE, one obtains:

This asserts that it is necessary that everything necessarily exists. It follows that it is not even possible for there to be contingent individuals. To see why, note that an actualist would define ‘contingent individual’ as follows:

NNE: xy y=x

Consequently, the claim that there are contingent individuals would be formulated as:x is contingent=_{df}y(y = x)

But it now follows from NNE that it is not possible that there are contingent individuals:xy(y = x)

(The proof is left as an exercise.) If this is a consequence of SQML, it is no wonder actualists are dissatisfied.xy(y = x)

Finally, there is CBF. For the actualist, the main problem with CBF
is that in SQML it implies NE in conjunction with the thesis known as
*Serious Actualism*. Serious Actualism is the thesis that it is
not possible for an object to have a property without existing, i.e.,
that if an object exemplifies a property at a world, it exists at
that world. [See Plantinga [1983], [1985], Menzel [1991], Pollock
[1985], and Deutsch [1993] for various discussions of Serious
Actualism.] In semantic terms, this amounts to the constraint that an
object in the extension of a property at a world must fall under the
range of the quantifier at that world. Serious Actualism is often
expressed by the following schema of the object language:

Note that SA is a theorem of SQML (the proof is a simple exercise) and seems consistent with the actualist point of view. But from SA and CBF, one can rederive NE from any (logically) necessary property in the system. (See A Derivation of NE from SA and CBF.) Thus, even if there were a way to block the direct derivation of NE, the alternative derivation of NE from CBF and SA shows that serious actualists could not accept SQML unless CBF is somehow invalidated.

SA: [ yy=x], where is atomic and containsx.

As noted, Arthur Prior was the first to realize the controversial consequences of SQML. Prior himself was a staunch actualist, and dealt with the problem by developing an alternative quantified modal logic that differs significantly from SQML, and which does not have the controversial principles above as theorems. A more detailed account of Prior's approach can be found in the supplementary document Prior's Modal Logic.

It is illuminating both to see exactly how Kripke was able to construct interpretations on which BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true and to see exactly how Kripke modified the logic of SQML so that these these schemata and sentences are no longer theorems. These techniques will be the subject of the next two subsections.

The central semantic difference between Kripke models and
interpretations for SQML is that, in a Kripke model, when a
quantified formula
*x*
is evaluated at a world **w**, the quantifier ranges only over the
objects that exist in the domain of **w**. Thus, in particular,
the sample clause in the definition of truth for quantification above
must be revised for Kripke models **M** as follows, where, again,
**f** is an assignment function:

The quantified formula ‘Again, a little less formally, ‘xPx’ is true_{M,f}atwjust in case, for all individualsaindom(w), ‘Px’ is true_{M,f[x,a]}atw, wheref[x,a] isfiff(x) =a, and otherwise is just likefexcept that it assignsatoxinstead off(x).

Kripke's changes to the model theory of first-order modal languages are relatively simple. Nonetheless, unlike the model theory for SQML, Kripke's model theory yields a set of logical truths that is fully compatible with actualism. In particular, all three of the principles with which the actualist takes issue -- BF, NE, and CBF -- turn out to be invalid in Kripke's semantics. Consider first BF in the form

For definiteness, let be the formula ‘xx

It should be obvious why NE is also invalid in Kripke's semantics:
domains of worlds can be empty. Thus, let **M _{1}** be a
Kripke model containing at least one actual individual (i.e., at
least one object

Finally, we note that CBF is invalid in Kripke's semantics. First,
let **M _{2}** be a Kripke model in which NE is false. (We
just proved the existence of such a model in the previous paragraph,
of course.) Next, let the predicate ‘

Note that the invalidity of CBF opens the door back up to serious
actualism (SA) in Kripke's semantics, as it was the combination of SA
with CBF that led to trouble (i.e., trouble for the actualist) in
SQML. And it is easy to see formally that this is the case by
constructing a Kripke model in which SA is true. Note first that the
thesis of serious actualism can be expressed as the thesis that all
properties are existence-entailing; there is no possible world in
which something has a property but fails to exist in that world. In
first-order languages, properties are represented by predicates, and
having a property is represented semantically by being in the
extension of a predicate. Thus, to represent a property as
existence-entailing in a Kripke model, one simply ensures that, at
every possible world **w**, the extension of the predicate
representing that property consist only of things that exist in
**w**. Hence, to represent *all* properties as existence
entailing, and hence, to make SA true, one ensures that this is so
for all the predicates of one's language. Formally, then, let
**M _{3}** be any Kripke model satisfying the condition
that, for every

The compatibility of SA with Kripke's semantics is yet further
evidence of its suitability as a formal semantics for the
actualist. A question that remains is: What sort of *logic* does
this semantics yield?

SQML is sound and complete relative to
the semantics given for its language
**L** above. Since BF, NE, and CBF are invalid in Kripke's
semantics, SQML is obviously not sound and complete for it; more
specifically, it is not sound: some of SQML's theorems--notably, BF,
NE, and CBF--are not valid, as we saw in the previous section. Hence,
Kripke must modify SQML to block their derivation without blocking
the derivation of any valid formulas.

The key element to Kripke's solution to this problem is the generality interpretation of free variables. The proof of NE in SQML relies crucially on the ability to derive theorems involving free variables, and more specifically on the application of the rule of Necessitation to such theorems. As described in the supplementary document Proof of ‘Necessary Existence’ in S5, the proof makes use of the following instances of logical axioms:

*x=x**y**y**x**x**x*.

To repair this "flaw" in SQML, Kripke proposes no changes to SQML
other than this: a formula
containing free variables
*x*_{1},...,
*x _{n}*,

*x x=x**x*[*y**y**x**x**x*]

The failure of those particular proofs, of course, does not mean that the principles in question cannot be proved some other way. However, Kripke guarantees their unprovability in his system by showing that the system is sound and complete relative to his semantics. Soundness, in particular, tells us that no invalid formula is provable in the system. Hence, since NE, CBF, and BF are all invalid in Kripke's semantics, soundness guarantees that they are all unprovable in his system.

First, Kripke regards the loss of free variables from assertible
sentences as a mere inconvenience. However, much of mathematical
reasoning is carried out in terms of sentences with free variables,
and one should at least wonder why modal logic, as opposed to
classical logic, can't be formulated with free variables in
assertible sentences. Far more serious, however, is the fact is that,
as the system stands, one cannot add constants for contingent
beings. For suppose we add a constant ‘*c*’ to Kripke's
system. As noted in the last section,
*x x=x*
*x**y y=x**x x=x**x**y y=x**y y=c*.*y y=c**c*, whatever it may be, is a necessary being. Thus,
in Kripke's system as it stands, one cannot consistently assert,
e.g., that Socrates is a contingent being,
*y y=s*

Alarming as this problem might be, it is more a formal rather than a philosophical objection to Kripke's system. Though Kripke himself might not be particularly pleased at the prospect, it seems that the proper response to these problems is simply to alter those features of classical quantification theory and/or classical propositional modal logic that give rise to invalid inferences such as the above. (Arguably, Kripke has already made a similar move in adopting the generality interpretation of free variables.) Obvious suspects here are universal instantiation and necessitation. After all, there is nothing sacrosanct about either classical quantification theory or classical modal logic. If they are inconsistent with strong modal intuitions, then their revision is required and fully warranted.

So its current inability to name contingent beings does not of
itself constitute much of an objection to Kripke's system. It is
likely that it could be patched up so as to allow it this expressive
capacity. Far more serious is the fact that, despite the invalidity
and unprovability of the actualistically objectionable principles BF,
NE, and CBF, Kripke's system does not appear to have escaped
ontological commitment to possibilia. A model theory provides a
*semantics* for a language -- an account of how the truth value
of a given sentence of the language is determined in a model by the
meanings of its semantically significant component parts, notably,
the meanings of its names, predicates, and quantifiers. Now,
truth-in-a-model is not the same as truth simpliciter. However,
truth simpliciter is usually understood simply to be truth in an
*intended* model, a model consisting of the very things that the
language is intuitively understood to be "about". So if we are to
take Kripke models seriously as an account of truth for modal
languages, then we must identify the intended models of those
languages. And for this there seems little option but to take
Kripke's talk of possible worlds literally: the set W in an intended
Kripke model is the set of all possible worlds. If so, however, it
appears that Kripke is committed to possibilia. For suppose the
modal operators are literally quantifiers over possible worlds. And
suppose it is possible that there be objects -- Aliens, for example
-- that are distinct from all actually existing objects. Letting
‘*A*’ express the property of being an Alien, we can represent
this proposition by means of the sentence
*yAy* &*x**Ax*’,
i.e., while there could be Aliens
(*y**Ay**x**Ax*).
On Kripke's semantics, the first conjunct of this sentence can be
true only if there is a possible world *w* and an object
*a* such that *a* is an Alien at *w*. But given the
second conjunct, any such object *a* is distinct from all
actually existing things. Hence, using Kripke's semantics to provide
us with an account of truth, we find ourselves quantifying directly
over possible worlds and mere *possibilia*. That BF, NE, and
CBF are unprovable in Kripke's system, it seems, is metaphysically
irrelevant. For it appears that, nonetheless, the semantics itself
is wholly committed to possibilism.

An option for the actualist here, perhaps, is simply to deny that
Kripke models have any genuine metaphysical bite. The real prize is
the logic, which describes the modal facts of the matter
*directly*. The model theory is simply a formal
*instrument* that enables us to prove that the logic possesses
certain desirable metatheoretic features, notably consistency. But
this position is unsatisfying at best. Consider ordinary "Tarskian"
model theory for nonmodal first-order logic. Intuitively, this model
theory is more than just a formal artifact. Rather, when one
constructs an intended model for a given language, it shows clearly
how the semantic values of the relevant parts of a sentence of
first-order logic -- the objects, properties, relations, etc. in the
world those parts signify -- contribute to the actual truth value of
the sentence. The semantics provides insight into the "word-world"
connection that explains how it is that sentences can express truth
and falsity, how they can carry good and bad information. The
embarrassing question for the actualist who would adopt the proposed
instrumentalist view of Kripke semantics is: what distinguishes
Kripkean model theory from Tarskian? Why does the latter yield
insight into the word-world connection and not the former? Distaste
for the metaphysical consequences of Kripke semantics at best
provides a motivation for finding an answer to these questions, but
it is not itself an answer. The actualist owes us either an
explanation of how Kripke's model theory provides a semantics for
modal languages that does not commit us to possibilism, or else he
owes us a semantical alternative.

Examples of individual essences are a little harder to come by than
examples of essential properties. There are fairly strong intuitive
grounds for the thesis that having arisen from the exact sperm and
egg that one has is an individual essence of every human person, or
at least of every human body. A different sperm and the same egg,
say, would have resulted in a perhaps similar but numerically
distinct person. Less controversial from a purely logical standpoint
are what Plantinga calls *haecceities*, i.e., properties like
**being Plantinga**, or perhaps, **being identical with
Plantinga**, that are "directly about" some particular object.
Pretty clearly, Plantinga has the property **being Plantinga**
essentially -- he could not exist and lack it; any world in which he
exists is, *ex hypothesi*, a world in which he is
*Plantinga*, and hence a world in which he exhibits the
property in question. Moreover, nothing but the individual Plantinga
could have had that property; necessarily, anything that has it is
identical to Plantinga. Hence, **being Plantinga** is an
individual essence. Importantly, Plantinga takes individual
essences, like all properties, to exist necessarily, even if they are
not exemplified. (Interested readers may wish to read the
supplementary document
Background Assumptions for Plantinga's Account.)

Briefly put, Plantinga's solution to the possibilist challenge is to
replace the possibilia of Kripke's semantics with individual
essences. We follow the development of this solution found in Jager
[1982]. Specifically, an interpretation **I** of the first-order
modal language **L**, consists again of two mutually disjoint
nonempty sets: the set of possible worlds and the set of individual
essences. And, as with Kripke, there is a function **dom** that
assigns to each possible world **w** its own distinct domain
**dom**(**w**). However, instead of the possible individuals
that exist in **w**, this domain consists of those individual
essences that are *exemplified* in **w**, or, more exactly,
that *would have been exemplified* if **w** had been
actual.

But how, exactly, does **I** assign values to predicates? After
all, it is not individual essences to which predicates apply at
worlds, it is the things that exemplify them; **being an Alien**,
if it were exemplified, would not be a property of essences, but of
individuals. Plantinga's trick is to talk, not about
exemplification, but *coexemplification*. Properties **P**
and **Q** are *coexemplified* just in case some individual
has both **P** and **Q**. And for any world **w**, **P**
and **Q** are *coexemplified in w* just in case, if

A relation **R** is coexemplified with properties
**P**_{1},..., **P**_{n} (in that
order) just in case (i) there are individuals
**i**_{1},..., **i**_{n} that
exemplify **P**_{1},..., **P**_{n},
respectively, and (ii) **i**_{1},...,
**i**_{n} stand in the relation **R**. And
for any world **w**, **R** is coexemplified with properties
**P**_{1},..., **P**_{n} in **w**
just in case, if **w** were actual, **R** would be
coexemplified with **P**_{1},...,
**P**_{n}. In Plantinga's system, then, a
1-place predicate *P* *applies to* a given individual
essence **e** at a world **w** just in case the property
expressed by *P* is coexemplified with the **e** at
**w**. And an *n*-place predicate *R* applies to
essences **e**_{1},..., **e**_{n} at
**w** just in case the relation expressed by *R* is
coexemplified with **e**_{1},...,
**e**_{n} at **w**. For any individual
essences **e**_{1},..., **e**_{n} and possible
world **w** in our interpretation **I**, then, **I**
specifies, for each *n*-place predicate *R*, whether or not
*R* applies to **e**_{1},...,
**e**_{n} at **w**.

The denotation function **f** for **I** works just as in SQML
and Kripke semantics, only now, of course, it assigns essences to
variables instead of possibilia. Given this, we can now illustrate
the definition of truth for this model theory by means of several
instances of its most important clauses:

- The open, atomic formula ‘
*Px*’ is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case**I**specifies that ‘*P*’ applies to**d**_{I}_{,f}(*x*) at**w**. - The quantified formula ‘
*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individual essences**e**in**dom**(**w**), ‘*Px’*is true_{I,f[x,e]}at**w**, where**f**[*x*,**e**] is**f**if**f**(*x*) =**e**, and otherwise is just like**f**except that it assigns**e**to*x*instead of**f**(*x*). (A little less formally, ‘*xPx’*is true_{I,f}at**w**just in case, for all individual essences**e**, the predicate ‘*P*’ applies to**e**at**w**.) - The open, modal formula
‘’
(‘’) is
true
_{I,f}at**w**just in case for every (some) possible world**w**, ‘’ is true_{I,f}at**w**.

Notice that Plantinga's account also has no problem dealing with iterated modalities. The problem, recall, was that sentences like

(9)appear to require mere possibilia to serve as the values of the quantifier, since no actually existing thing could be a son of the current pope. For Plantinga, the solution is simply that quantifiers range over haecceities, and that, in particular, (9) is true in virtue of their being an unexemplified haecceity which, in some possible world is coexemplified with the propertyx(Sxp&Px)

In sum, then, in Plantinga's account there is an individual essence
for every *possibile* in Kripke's. And for every property that
every *possibile* enjoys at any given world **w** in Kripke's
account, there is an individual essence that is coexemplified with
that property in (the Plantingian counterpart of) **w**.
Plantinga's semantics would thus appear to generate precisely the
same truth values for the sentences of a modal language as Kripke's.
Hence, it would appear that Plantinga has indeed successfully
developed a semantics for modal languages that comports with
actualist scruples.

Several philosophers -- notably, Robert Adams and, building on work
of Prior [1977], Kit Fine -- have developed possible world semantics
that are strongly actualist. The approach in Adams [1974] centers
around Adams' notion of a possible world, or "world story". For
Adams, a world story is a *maximally possible* set of
propositions, that is, a set **s** of propositions such that (i)
for any proposition **p**, s contains either **p** or its
negation **p**, and (ii) it is possible that
all the memebers of **s** be true
together.^{[5]}.
A proposition **p** is *true* in a world story **w**,
then, just in case **p** is a member of **w**. Thus, Adams
takes a proposition to be possible just in case it is true in some
world story. In particular, then, the semantics of our paradigmatic
proposition **Possibly, there are Aliens**, i.e.,
formally,

is straightforward and, on the face of it, innocuous from a strongly actualist perspective: (1) is true if and only if (the proposition expressed by)

(1) xAx,

(14) ‘ xAx’ (i.e., the propositionThere are Aliens) is true at some world.

Now, if Fine's account were to parallel Adams', then Fine would now
say that, for a proposition to be possible is for it to be true in
some possible world, i.e., to be entailed by some world proposition.
But Fine is more mindful of the problems that contingent propositions
raise for actualism. Consequently, he suggests alternative truth
conditions for propositions of the form **Possibly p**, namely,
that it is *possible* that **p** be true in some possible
world. Thus, for Fine, the full analysis of the iterated modal
proposition (9) --
*x*(*Sxp*
&
*Px*) -- is as follows: (9) is true if
and only if

(18), in turn, is true if and only if

(18) It is possible that ‘ x(Sxp&Px)’ (i.e., the propositionWojtyla has a son who could have become a priest) is true at some worldw.

which, in turn, is true if and only if

(19) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp&Px’ (i.e., the proposition) is true at some worldxis a son of Wojtyla andxcould have become a priestw,

Thus, all that Fine's account requires in its analyses of (9) is the

(20) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp’ (i.e., the proposition) is true at some worldxis a son of Wojtylawand, it is possible that, for some worldu, ‘Px’ (i.e., the proposition) is true atxis a priestu.

For McMichael, a primitive logical relation of *inclusion*
can hold between properties and relations. Because it is a
primitive, it cannot be defined, but, intuitively, in the case of
properties, the idea is that one property **P** includes another
**Q** just in case, necessarily, anything that has **P** has
**Q**. Thus, the property **being red** includes the property
**being colored**. Again, intutively once again, one binary
relation **R** includes another
**R** just in case, necessarily, for any
objects **x** and **y**, if **x** bears **R** to
**y**, then **x** bears
**R** to **y**. So, for example,the
conjunctive relation **being both a child and an heir of**
includes the relation **being a child of**.

Inclusion can also hold between an *n*+1-place relation and an
*n*-place relation, relative to one of the argument places of
the
former.^{[6]}
Thus, in particular, a 2-place relation **Q** can include a
property **P**, relative to one of its two argument places:
intuitively, **Q** includes **P**, relative to its first
argument place, if and only if, necessarily, whenever two things
**a** and **b** stand in the relation **Q**, **a**
exemplifies **P**. And if the inclusion were with respect to the
second argument place, of course, it would be **b** that
exemplifies **P**. So, for example, the **child-of** relation,
relative to its first argument place, includes the property **being
a child of something**; whenever any object **a** bears the
**child-of** relation to some object **b**, **a** has the
existentially quantified property **being a child of something**.
Similarly, **child-of** includes the property **being a parent of
something** relative to its second argument place.

A (unary) role is just a "purely qualitative" property of a
certain sort, where (as described in more detail in the supplementary
document on
Qualitative Essences)
a purely qualitative property is a property that "involves" no
particular individuals. Thus, such properties as **being a
philosopher** and **being someone's mother or maternal aunt**
are purely qualitative, while **being a student of Quine** and
**being Johnson's mother or a friend of Boswell** are not. Given
this, McMichael defines a property **P** to be a *unary
role* if (i) it is exemplifiable, (ii) it is purely qualitative,
and (iii) for any purely qualitative property **Q**, either
**P** includes **Q** or **P** includes the complement
**-Q** of **Q**. A role is thus a complete (nonmodal)
"characterization" of the way something could be, qualitatively.
Intuitively, then, the role of a given object is a "conjunction" of
all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive properties the object
exemplifies. Thus, for example, Socrates' role includes the
properties **being a philosopher**, **being snub-nosed**,
**being the most famous teacher of a famous philosopher**,
**being condemned to death** and so
on.^{[7]}
The notion of role generalizes in a natural way to all
*n*-place relations, including, notably, propositions (i.e.,
0-place relations) and binary (i.e., 2-place) relations. Thus, the
binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is, intuitively, a
conjunction of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive binary
relations that Boswell bears to
Johnson.^{[8]}
As one might suspect, it can be shown on McMichael's theory that a
binary role includes a unique unary role with respect to each of its
argument places. In particular, the binary role that Boswell bears
to Johnson includes Boswell's unary role relative to its first
argument place and Johnson's relative to its second.

Now (as also explained in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences), Adams [1979] has argued persuasively that no purely qualitative property, no matter how complex, can serve as an individual essence for a contingent being. Hence, in general, roles -- being purely qualitative -- are not individual essences. Rather, they are general properties that are (in general) exemplifiable by different things (though not necessarily things in the same possible world). Because of this, none of the objections to Plantinga's haecceities is relevant to roles, as the fact that haecceities are individual essences lies at the heart of those objections. At the same time, McMichael is able to provide a semantics for (9) that does not run afoul of the iterated modalities objection. The basic trick is to

...alter the criterion for deciding what an individual might have done. Instead of saying that what an individual might have done is whatThus, a little more formally, wherehedoes in some possible world, let us say that what an individual might have done is whatany suchindividual does in some possible world....To determine what Socrates might have done, we don't look for worlds in which he appears, but instead we look for roles in possible worlds which are accessible to Socrates' actual role. If one of these roles includes a certain property, then that property is one Socrates could have had; otherwise, it is not [ibid, 73].

is true just in case some unary role accessible to the actual role of Socrates includes the property of being foolish.

(21) Possibly, Socrates is foolish ( Fs)

Similar to Plantinga's semantics, then, quantifiers do not range over individuals, but over roles. This enables McMichael to avoid the iterated modalities objection and provide a compositional semantics for our iterative paradigm (9). Specifically, (9) is true if and only if

(22) captures the idea that an individual

(22) Some role Raccessible to Wojtyla's actual roleRincludes the property_{k}being a parent of someone(i.e., the property [yxCxy] expressed by the open formula ‘xCxy’).

That is, in accordance with McMichael's recursive definition of truth, (23) unpacks the quantified formula ‘

(23) Some binary role Sthat includes thechild-ofrelation (i.e., the relation expressed by the atomic formula ‘Cxy’) also includes, relative to its second argument place, the roleR(a role accessible to Wojtyla's actual roleR)._{k}

To capture the intuition that no such child could be identical to
any actually existing thing, then, McMichael can simply deny that the
role
**R** that would be exemplified by such a
child is accessible to the role of any actually existing thing.

All non-skeptical approaches to modality agree that Kripke models
provide key insights into the meaning of our modal discourse and the
nature of modal reality. However, as we have seen, the naive
"intended" model of Kripke semantics leads to possibilism. The
standard actualist response -- following David Lewis, "ersatzism" --
has been to define actualistically acceptable notions of possible
worlds and possible individuals to serve as replacements for the
elements of **W** and **D** in the naive intended model,
thereby (or so it is argued) preserving the semantical and
metaphysical benefits of Kripke models while avoiding ontological
commitment to *possibilia*. As just seen above, however,
ersatzism is still problematic. By contrast, the no-worlds account
does not attempt to identify worlds as acceptable abstract entities
of some sort. Rather, the notion of a possible world is abandoned
altogether.

To get at the idea, note first that the notion of an intended Tarski
model makes perfectly good sense for a formalization of nonmodal
discourse about the actual world. To illustrate, suppose we have a
given a piece of nonmodal discourse about a certain event, a baseball
game, say. Suppose now we formalize that discourse in a nonmodal
language
*L*;
that is, for each referring expression in the disourse (e.g., ‘Mark
McGwire’, ‘second inning’, etc.), there is a unique constant of
*L*,
and for every simple verb phrase in the discourse (‘is a home run’,
‘is out’, ‘relieves’, etc.) there is a unique predicate of
*L*. Then we can form a Tarski model
**M**_{L}*L* whose domain consists of the actual
objects that the speakers are talking about in the discourse (fans,
players, equipment, etc.) and which interprets the predicates of
*L* so that they are true of exactly those
(*n*-tuples of objects in the domain that are in the extension
of the corresponding verb phrases of the discourse. In this way we
form the intended model of
*L*, the piece of the world that it is
intended to be about.

According to proponents of the no-worlds account, the fallacy of
both ersatzism and possibilism is the inference that things must work
in largely the same way with regard to Kripke models. A Kripke model
is basically an indexed collection of Tarski models. Just as there
is an intended Tarski model for a nonmodal language
*L* constructed from the actual world, the
accounts above infer that, for a given formalization *L* of
modal discourse, there must be an intended Kripke model constructed
from all possible worlds. And, depending on one's tolerance for
possibilia, this leads either to possibilism or one of its ersatz
variations.

For no-worlders, the modal upshot of a Kripke model lies in its
structure rather than its content. The specific elements of a Kripke
model are irrelevant. Rather, under appropriate conditions, it is
the form of a Kripke model alone that tells us something about modal
reality. Specifically, the model theory of Kripke semantics is
retained in the no-world account. The elements of a model are
irrelevant; it is easiest just to take them to be pure sets, or
ordinal numbers, or some other type of familiar mathematical object.
Consequently, there can be no notion of a single intended model,
because, for every model, there are infinitely many others that are
structurally isomorphic to it, and structure is all that matters on
the no-worlds account. In place of intended models, the no-worlds
account offers the notion of an *intended** model. To get at
the idea, suppose one has an intended Tarski model **M** of the
actual world, a model that actually contains entities in the world
and assigns extensions to predicates that reflect the actual meanings
of the adjectives and verb phrases those predicates formalize. Now
replace the objects in that model with abstract objects of some ilk
to obtain a new model
**M** that is structurally isomorphic to
**M**. Then
**M** also models the world under a mapping,
or embedding, that takes each element
**e** of
**M** to the element **e** that it
replaced in **M**. We can thus justifiably think of
**M** as a sort of intended model because,
even though it doesn't necessary *contain* anything but pure
sets (or some other type of mathematical object), under an
appropriate embedding it models the actual world no less than
**M**. To distinguish models like
**M** that require a nontrivial embedding
into the world from models like **M**, we call the former
*intended** models.

For no-worlders, the notion of an intended* Tarski model is all that
is needed for modeling the modal facts. From these a notion of an
intended* Kripke model can be defined. Assume that **L** is a
model language that formalizes some range of modal discourse about
the world. Roughly, then, an intended* Kripke model **M** is
simply a Kripke model such that (i) the Tarski model indexed by the
distinguished index **w _{0}** is an intended* Tarski model
of the actual world, (ii) every Tarski model

Truth in a model on the the no-worlds account is defined as usual as
truth at the distinguish index **w _{0}** of the model,
hence, a sentence
is true simpliciter if and only if it is true at
the distinguished index of some (hence, any) intended* Kripke model.
Given the definition of an intended* model, it follows that a modal
formula
‘’ is true if and only if,
for some intended* Kripke-model

that is, given the definition of an intended* Kripke model, if and only if there is a Tarski model

(20) For some intended* Kripke model M, there is a Tarski modelMinMin which ‘xAx’ is true,

For the no-worlder, then, intended* Kripke models adequately represent the modal structure of the world simply by virtue of their own modal properties. Since Kripke models are constructed entirely out of existing objects, the semantics for modal logic requires no distinction between what is actual and what is possible. It therefore conforms with the thesis of actualism, but does so without the elaborate metaphysical apparatus of the ersatzers.

With this basic idea in hand, the ‘new actualists’ point out that our ordinary modal claims can be given a straightforward analysis by: (1) regimenting ordinary modal discourse in the simplest possible way using the language and logic of the simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) and (2) semantically interpreting SQML by appealing to contingently concrete objects and contingently nonconcrete objects (both of which are assumed to actually exist). This interpretation, the new actualist argues, reveals that the problematic theorems of SQML -- most notably, the Barcan Formula (BF), the Converse Barcan Formula (CBF), and the Necessary Existence (NE) theorems -- do not contradict our modal intuitions, once those intuitions are understood in terms of a more subtle conception of the abstract/concrete distinction.

To see why, reconsider the definition and discussion of SQML and
reexamine BF. From the fact that there might have been aliens
(*xAx*),
BF requires only that there exist something that *could have
been* an Alien
(*xAx*).
But, it was asked, doesn't this contradict the intuition (described
at the very outset) that *nothing could have been an Alien*?
Here, the new actualist argues that this intuition is true only when
it is properly understood as the intuition that *no concrete object
could have been an Alien*. Recall our thought experiment at the
outset, which asked us to "imagine a race of beings that is very
different from any life-form that actually exists anywhere in the
universe; different enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing
could have been an Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have
been a fruitfly." The relevant intuition, that nothing could have
been an Alien, is grounded in the fact that when we look around us
and examine all the concrete objects that there are, we note that
none of those objects could have been an Alien (just as no gorilla
could have been a fruitfly). However, this leaves room to claim that
there exist (contingently) *non*concrete objects which could
have been Aliens. According to the new actualist, these contingently
nonconcrete objects have been overlooked because (1) no one has
correctly drawn the proper distinction between contingently
nonconcrete and necessarily nonconcrete objects, and (2) everyone has
assumed that concreteness was an *essential* property of
concrete objects (see below).

Thus, according to the new actualist, whenever there is a true claim
of the form "There might have been something which is *F*", BF
doesn't imply anything that is incompatible with our modal
intuitions. For the conclusion that it forces, namely, that "There
exists something that might have been an *F*", does not require
us to suppose that there is some concrete object which might have
been *F*. BF need only require the existence of contingently
nonconcrete objects which might have been *F*. Similar
reasoning is developed in the supplementary document
Why CBF and NE Are Harmless Consequences of SQML.

Once it is seen that BF requires only contingently nonconcrete objects and not possibilia, it is natural to reconceive the nature of concrete objects. According to new actualism, ordinary concrete objects are concrete at some worlds and not at others. This is the sense in which they are contingent objects. Traditional actualists have described worlds where these objects are not concrete as worlds where these objects don't exist or have any kind of being. By contrast, the new actualist just rests with their nonconcreteness at the world in question, and argues that that should suffice to account for our intuition that such objects "are not to be found" in such a world. Moreover, new actualists reconceive the idea of an "essential" property of a concrete object. Instead of saying that Socrates is essentially a person because he is a person in every possible world where he exists, new actualists say that he is essentially a person because he is a person in every world where he is concrete.

So by recognizing the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects
and by reconceiving both the contingency of concrete objects and the
notion of an essential property in what seem to be harmless ways,
there appears to be a way to interpret SQML so that it is consistent
with actualism. Specifically, in the "intended" new actualist model,
everything in the one domain **D** both exists and is actual.
**D** includes: (1) (contingently) concrete objects, (2)
necessarily concrete objects (if there are such), (3) contingently
nonconcrete objects, and (4) necessarily nonconcrete objects (if
there are such). All of these objects in **D** are said to
actually exist.

New actualism appears to lack the awkward features that plague other forms of actualism. In contrast to Kripke's System, the metalanguage does not quantify over possibilia and object language quantifiers can range over everything the metalanguage quantifiers range over. In contrast to Prior's approach, no distinction between two kinds of necessity is needed. In contrast to Plantinga's haecceitism, there is an objectual interpretation of quantified modal logic which is expressible in terms of the basic notion of an individual exemplifying properties (rather than in the less basic terminology of coexemplification). In contrast to Adams' world story approach, there is no puzzle arising from propositions which do not exist at worlds where their constituents do not exist--propositions and their constituents exist necessarily, though the contingent constituents of propositions fail to be concrete at some worlds. In particular, all objects exist necessarily for the new actualist, and hence can be quantified over relative to any possible world, it should be clear that the new actualist has no trouble with the semantics of iterated modalities. (Details are provided in the supplementary document New Actualism and Iterated Modalities for the interested reader.) In contrast to Fine's world propositions approach, object language modal operators are fully interpreted in terms of worlds alone, and hence can be thought of as providing a genuine semantical analysis of the modal operators -- although, admittedly, this will depend on a conception of worlds that does not itself involve a primitive notion of propositional possibility. At the least, the account provides as much explanatory power as Fine's in a manner that is both ontologically simpler and more direct. In contrast to McMichael's role theory, modal truths such as "Socrates might have been a carpenter" are genuinely about Socrates. In contrast to the no-worlders, the idea that necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds is preserved. The intended interpretation has in its domain all of the objects that actually exist and extensions can be distributed to properties at the various worlds in just the way that is required by the modal facts. Modal discourse, then, is directly about an independent reality free of possibilia, and the relationship between the formal language and the intended model exactly mirrors the relationship between ordinary modal language and the reality that grounds modal truth.

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*First published: June 16, 2000*

*Content last modified: June 16, 2000*