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Supplement to Actualism

Prior then undermines the interdefinability of possibility and
necessity by distinguishing ‘not possibly false’ from ‘necessarily
true’ as follows. Using the operator
‘’ as primitive, Prior labels any
statement
for which there is no world where it is false as
‘not possibly false’ (i.e.,
).
For example, when *a* is a contingent being, the statement
‘*PaPa*’ is not possibly false, since there
is no world in which the statement is false. However, since this
statement will be neither true nor false (but rather unstatable) at
worlds where *a* doesn't exist, it is not a ‘necessarily true’
statement in the full or strong sense of being true in every possible
world. Prior defines this strong sense of necessity in his object
language in terms of possibility and statability as
follows:
is necessarily true iff
is necessarily statable and
is not possibly false. In formal terms:

So, whenS&

Given this distinction between weak necessity (‘not possibly false’) and strong necessity, Prior must make sure that the Rule of Necessitation never allows us to infer the strong necessity of a theorem of logic that is only weakly necessary. Thus, for Prior, the Rule of Necessitation must be reformulated as follows:

Revised RN: If , then (Thus, after establishing thatS)

If , thenIt is now easy to see that BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems of Prior's logic. The proof of BF relied both on the interdefinability of possibility and necessity as well as on the unrevised Rule of Necessitation. (Specifically, the interdefinability of possibility and necessity plays a role behind the scenes in the second line of the second subproof in the derivation of BF, and the Rule of Necessitation was used in line 2 in the third subproof and in line 2 of the final, assembled proof of BF.) The proof of NE is undermined since it relied on unrevised RN as well. (Specifically, Revised RN will not permit the inference on line 3 of the derivation of NE.) Finally, the proof of CBF cannot proceed in the usual way using Revised RN. (Specifically, we cannot appeal to Revised RN on line 2 of the derivation of CBF.)

Since BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems, one might think that
Prior had succeeded in finding the correct modal logic for
actualism. However, few actualists have adopted this logic. The
interdefinability of possibility and necessity has seemed just too
elegant to abandon---it seems to capture something deep about the
logical relationships among our modal beliefs. Actualists are divided
on the queston of Prior's restriction on RN---some see it as
unnecessary while others accept some such weakening of RN. Probably
the most awkward consequence of Prior's logic, however, is the
fact that logical contradictions which aren't necessarily
statable turn out to be weakly possible! Before we explain why this is
so, note that when *a* is a contingent being, the claim *y*(*y = a*) is not possibly false ---
it is true at any world where *a* exists, and is neither true
nor false at worlds where *a* fails to exist. As Deutsch
observes, "Yet surely there is a sense in which ‘Prior
[*a*] exists’ might have been *false*; and there is
no way to express this in Prior's system" ([1990], 92-93). Prior
here would emphasize that this weak necessity of *a*'s
existence doesn't contradict the fact that *a* is a
contingent being, for the fact that *a* is contingent is
properly expressed by the fact that neither *y*(*y = a*) nor its negation are
necessarily true (since neither is necessarily statable). However, if
that is what it is to say that a fact is contingent, then any literal
contradiction mentioning *a* will be contingent! For example,
the contradiction *Pa* & *Pa* is
not necessarily true, nor is its negation, since neither is statable
in a world where *a* doesn't exist. So this contradiction
becomes a contingent claim. Indeed, if we suppose that (using Prior's defined sense of ) defines a weak sense in which is
possibly true, it turns out that both the formulas *y*(*y = a*) and the
contradictory formula *Pa* & *Pa*
are possibly true in exactly this sense. As I have put it elsewhere
([1991], 348), Prior's modal logic "cannot distinguish the
expression of [*a*'s] contingency from the possibility of
manifest repugnancies".

Christopher Menzel

*First published: June 16, 2000*

*Content last modified: June 16, 2000
*