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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Actualism

Prior's Modal Logic

One of the first philosophical logicians to think about these problems was Arthur Prior. He pointed out that SQML is "haunted by the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily" ([1968], p. 48). His goal was to develop a modal logic for contingent beings (see Prior [1957] and [1967]). Prior developed a solution to these problems by rejecting the interdefinability of the ‘necessity’ and ‘possibility’ operators and restricting the Rule of Necessitation. The central notion that underlies Prior's system is the notion of necessary statability. Prior's idea is that when a is a contingent being, then propositions about a are not even statable in a world where a doesn't exist; i.e., such propositions are not necessarily statable. Intuitively, only those formulas which are about necessary beings or which are wholly general in character are necessarily statable. Thus, Prior introduces the modal claim S to indicate that the proposition denoted by is necessarily statable.

Prior then undermines the interdefinability of possibility and necessity by distinguishing ‘not possibly false’ from ‘necessarily true’ as follows. Using the operator ‘’ as primitive, Prior labels any statement for which there is no world where it is false as ‘not possibly false’ (i.e., ). For example, when a is a contingent being, the statement ‘PaPa’ is not possibly false, since there is no world in which the statement is false. However, since this statement will be neither true nor false (but rather unstatable) at worlds where a doesn't exist, it is not a ‘necessarily true’ statement in the full or strong sense of being true in every possible world. Prior defines this strong sense of necessity in his object language in terms of possibility and statability as follows: is necessarily true iff is necessarily statable and is not possibly false. In formal terms:

So, when a is a contingent being, ‘PaPa’ is not a necessary truth. But when ‘a’ denotes an object that necessarily exists, ‘Pa Pa’ will be necessarily true. Also, completely general sentences like ‘xPxxPx’ will be necessarily true.

Given this distinction between weak necessity (‘not possibly false’) and strong necessity, Prior must make sure that the Rule of Necessitation never allows us to infer the strong necessity of a theorem of logic that is only weakly necessary. Thus, for Prior, the Rule of Necessitation must be reformulated as follows:

Revised RN: If , then (S )
Thus, after establishing that PaPa is a theorem of logic, we cannot infer that (PaPa). However, we can infer that (PaPa), since Prior does accept the following rule of inference:
If , then
It is now easy to see that BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems of Prior's logic. The proof of BF relied both on the interdefinability of possibility and necessity as well as on the unrevised Rule of Necessitation. (Specifically, the interdefinability of possibility and necessity plays a role behind the scenes in the second line of the second subproof in the derivation of BF, and the Rule of Necessitation was used in line 2 in the third subproof and in line 2 of the final, assembled proof of BF.) The proof of NE is undermined since it relied on unrevised RN as well. (Specifically, Revised RN will not permit the inference on line 3 of the derivation of NE.) Finally, the proof of CBF cannot proceed in the usual way using Revised RN. (Specifically, we cannot appeal to Revised RN on line 2 of the derivation of CBF.)

Since BF, NE, and CBF are no longer theorems, one might think that Prior had succeeded in finding the correct modal logic for actualism. However, few actualists have adopted this logic. The interdefinability of possibility and necessity has seemed just too elegant to abandon---it seems to capture something deep about the logical relationships among our modal beliefs. Actualists are divided on the queston of Prior's restriction on RN---some see it as unnecessary while others accept some such weakening of RN. Probably the most awkward consequence of Prior's logic, however, is the fact that logical contradictions which aren't necessarily statable turn out to be weakly possible! Before we explain why this is so, note that when a is a contingent being, the claim y(y = a) is not possibly false --- it is true at any world where a exists, and is neither true nor false at worlds where a fails to exist. As Deutsch observes, "Yet surely there is a sense in which ‘Prior [a] exists’ might have been false; and there is no way to express this in Prior's system" ([1990], 92-93). Prior here would emphasize that this weak necessity of a's existence doesn't contradict the fact that a is a contingent being, for the fact that a is contingent is properly expressed by the fact that neither y(y = a) nor its negation are necessarily true (since neither is necessarily statable). However, if that is what it is to say that a fact is contingent, then any literal contradiction mentioning a will be contingent! For example, the contradiction Pa & Pa is not necessarily true, nor is its negation, since neither is statable in a world where a doesn't exist. So this contradiction becomes a contingent claim. Indeed, if we suppose that (using Prior's defined sense of ) defines a weak sense in which is possibly true, it turns out that both the formulas y(y = a) and the contradictory formula Pa & Pa are possibly true in exactly this sense. As I have put it elsewhere ([1991], 348), Prior's modal logic "cannot distinguish the expression of [a's] contingency from the possibility of manifest repugnancies".

Copyright © 2000 by
Christopher Menzel

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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000