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Now, there surely are some purely qualitative individual essences, e.g., being smaller than every other prime number. However, the only clear examples of such belong to necessary beings like the number 2. The real question is whether contingent beings have purely qualitative essences. Adams  has argued convincingly that they do not. His central argument is that, given any possible world w, there is a world Sym(w) that is "symmetrical" with respect to w. The idea of symmetry here is difficult to define precisely, but the intuitive idea is that Sym(w) contains two parts, each of which is a sort of "copy" of w. One of these copies --- call it C1 -- is (but for properties arising from the existence of the other copy) identical to w in both qualititative and nonqualitative respects, and in particular contains exactly the same objectsas w. The other copy --- call it C2 --- is an exact qualitative replica of w, i.e., a copy that is indistinguishable from w in all qualitative respects (other than those arising from the existence of C1). Every object in C1, and hence in w thus has a qualitative "doppelgänger" in C2, an exact replica that has all of its purely qualitative properties. Given this, it seems that there is a possible world w such that Sym(w) = Sym(w), but where now w is identical with C2, and where C1 is the replica. It follows that, for every possible world w, there is another world w that is qualitatively identical with w, but which contains only doppelgängers of the objects in w.
Now, one might argue that all that follows from the example is that, for any object x and any world w containing x, there is a distinct object y in some other world w that has all of x's qualitative nonmodal properties in w. That is, Adams' argument from symmetrical worlds only makes plausible the idea that, necessarily, every object x has, as one might say, a de facto doppelgänger, something qualitatively identical to it with regard to the properties it just happens to exemplify. It does not follow that, necessarily, there is a complete, or modal doppelgänger y of x, i.e., that, for any world w in which x exists, there is a de facto doppelgänger of x with respect to w such that, in every other world w in which x exists, there is a world w such that y is a de facto doppelgänger in w of x with respect to w, and furthermore, that x is a modal doppelgänger of y. Hence it does not follow that there are no purely qualitative essences -- perhaps the purely qualitative modal properties of x are sufficient to distinguish it from any of its de facto doppelgängers, i.e., that none of its de facto doppelgängers are modal doppelgängers.
This is certainly a line worth pursuing. However, the central problem with it is that there appears to be no intuitive justification for this claim. Given that a doppelgänger y in w is qualititatively identical to x with respect to the nonmodal properties x exemplifies in w, what possible ground could there be for asserting that the same couldn't to true of y with respect to any world in which x exists? Intuitively, it seems, there are no such grounds. A defender of this line would have to provide some.
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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000