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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to Actualism

Why NE and CBF Are Harmless Consequences of SQML

To see in more detail why the Necessary Existence theorem (NE) of SQML is a harmless consequence of SQML, note that, according to new actualism, Socrates does exist necessarily, but since he is not necessarily concrete, NE does not imply that Socrates is a "necessary being". As we saw above, Socrates' contingency lies in the fact that he is concrete at some possible worlds and nonconcrete at others. Necessary beings, by contrast, are objects that are either concrete at every possible world (like Spinoza's God) or nonconcrete at every possible world (like numbers, sets, etc.). This means that the "contingently nonconcrete" are aptly named, since they are not necessary beings in either of these senses. So the claim that "Everything necessarily exists" (NE), does not conflict with our intuition that some beings are contingent, once the notion of what it is to be contingent is properly understood. Nor does its necessitation NNE. So if NE and NNE are acceptable consequences of SQML, the worry about the Converse Barcan Formula (CBF) disappears as well, for the fact that it, together with Serious Actualism (SA), implies NE, is of little consequence.

Copyright © 2000 by
Christopher Menzel

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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000