In contrast to the meaning the word ‘sophism’ had in ancient philosophy, ‘sophisma’ in medieval philosophy is a technical term with no pejorative connotation: a sophisma proper is a sentence (proposition) that raises a difficulty for logic or grammar: it is a proposition of which the truth value is difficult to determine, because it is ambiguous, puzzling or simply difficult to interpret, or a sentence that can be shown to be both grammatically correct and incorrect. Discussions of sophismata can be found in treatises of the twelfth century. Later they formed an important element of scholarly training in universities, featuring in different kinds of disputations: on a basic level the sophismata served to illustrate a theory, but they were also used to test the limits of a theory. The so-called sophismata-literature flourished during the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries; many important developments in philosophy, mainly in logic and natural philosophy, appeared in texts of this kind, where masters could feel free to investigate problems and develop their own views, much more than they could in more academic and strictly codified literary genres. In the wake of humanists' opposition against the educational practices of traditional universities, the genre of sophismata disappeared in the early sixteenth century.
- 1. The Word ‘Sophisma’
- 2. Description and Characteristics
- 3. The Various Roles of Sophismata
- 4. Sophismata Literature
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Although some medieval theologians — and humanists even more, of course, like Vivès or Rabelais — used the words ‘sophism’ or ‘sophist’ as a derogatory designation for quibbling philosophers, ‘sophisma’ in medieval philosophical literature has a very precise and technical sense. To avoid any confusion with fallacies and badly-constructed arguments, we shall here use the original term ‘sophisma’ rather than the word ‘sophism’ (which even nowadays still has a pejorative connotation).
A sophisma has several important characteristics. First of all, a sophisma proper is a sentence rather than an argument. In particular, a sophisma is a sentence that
- is odd or has odd consequences,
- is ambiguous, and can be true or false depending on how it is interpreted (or is taken to be ambiguous when in fact it is not), or
- is not puzzling in itself but only puzzling when it occurs in a definite context (or “case,” casus).
Here are some some examples of kind (1), sentences that are odd or have odd consequences:
This dog is your father.
A chimaera is a chimaera.
As examples of kind (2), ambiguous sentences that can be true or false depending on how they are interpreted, consider:
All the apostles are twelve.
The infinite are finite.
Every man is of necessity an animal.
As an example of kind (3), sentences that are not puzzling in themselves but only when they occur in a definite context (“case,” casus), consider:
The sentence ‘Socrates says something false’, in the case where Socrates says nothing other than ‘Socrates says something false’.
This sentence is paradoxical, and is one of the forms the Liar paradox.
Once the odd, ambiguous or puzzling sophisma-sentence is put forward, one should try to understand what it means, what it implies, and how it fits into or contradicts a particular theory under consideration. This is called “solving the sophisma,” and is the aim of the entire discussion. The way solutions are searched for and established is very similar to the highly formalized scholastic method for determining a “question”:
- First, one has to examine the arguments pro and contra.
- Second, one has to present one's own solution to the problem. (Sometimes this part of the discussion is preceded by certain theoretical remarks or clarifications that make the terminology more precise.)
- Third, one has to refute the arguments supporting the opposite answer.
Our first example comes from Peter of Spain's Syncategoreumata, chapter 4:
Omne animal preter hominem est irrationale.
(Every animal but man is irrational.)
In accordance with step (1), the pro and con arguments run:
Proof: The sentence ‘Every animal is irrational’ is false, and the only counterinstance is man. Therefore the sophisma is true.
Disproof: Every animal but man is irrational. Therefore every animal but this man is irrational. And that is false.
This particular sophisma is put forward to test the logical behaviour of the syncategorematic word ‘but’ (preter), more specifically, to consider the question what is excepted when we use an exceptive word.
In accordance with step (2), Peter of Spain solves the sophisma by saying that it is true without qualification, and that the argument pro is sound.
In accordance with step (3), the argument contra is rejected on the grounds that it is a fallacy, because in the sentence it starts off with, ‘Every animal but man is irrational,’ the expression ‘man’ has simple supposition, that is, it stands for man in general, whereas in the second sentence, ‘Therefore every animal but this man is irrational,’ the expression ‘this man’ has personal supposition, that is, it stands for an individual man. A second mistake in the disproof is that it proceeds from a combination of something less general with the distributive sign ‘every’ to a combination of something that is more general with the distributive sign ‘every’: in the first sentence, ‘every animal’ ranges over every animal other than man, whereas in the second sentence, the expression ‘every animal’ comprehends not only all the animals, but also every man other than this one.
The underlying logical problem in this sophisma according to Peter's exposition is the question of what kind of distribution is involved in propositions containing an exceptive expression in combination with the universal sign ‘every’. In this case, the solution to the sophisma is quite straightforward, as the disproof rests on an unwarranted change in distribution throughout the argument.
Another relatively simple example comes from Albert of Saxony, Sophismata, sophisma xi. The sophisma runs:
Omnes homines sunt asini vel homines et asini sunt asini.
(All men are donkeys or men and donkeys are donkeys.)
In accordance with step (1), here are the pro and contra arguments:
Proof: The sophisma is a copulative sentence (in modern logical terminology, a conjunction) each part of which is true; therefore the sophisma is true, since its analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys or men] and [donkeys are donkeys].
Disproof: The sophisma is a disjunctive sentence each part of which is false; therefore the sophisma is false, since its analysis becomes: [All men are donkeys] or [men and donkeys are donkeys].
This is a sophisma of the second kind above, one that rests on an ambiguity and can be read with a true interpretation or with a false interpretation. Many such sophismata, although not this one, resist being translated from Latin into another language without losing the ambiguity. For example, the sentence ‘aliquem asinum omnis homo videt’ can be translated by ‘Every man sees a donkey’ as well as by ‘There is a donkey that every man sees’. Similarly, in solving sophismata, sometimes Latin word-order is used as an arbitrary code for interpreting the sentence. For example, according to William Heytesbury, when the word ‘infinite’ is placed at the beginning of a sentence and belongs to the subject, it has to be interpreted as a syncategorematic term; in any other case, it is usually interpreted as a categorematic term (Heytesbury, Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va). Such word-order codes might seem like reasonable regimentations of language to a Latin-speaker, but in translation they often seem quite implausible and forced. No such problems arise with this example. (For clarity, square brackets have been inserted into the proof and disproof above, in order to indicate the ambiguity of the sophisma.)
In accordance with step (2) above, Albert of Saxony, who discusses this sophisma, solves it by just saying that it is either true or false depending on which interpretation we choose. He then takes the opportunity to review the basic principles governing the truth-value of copulative and disjunctive sentences.
In accordance with step (3), we would normally be required to refute the opposite answer. In this case, however, there is nothing to refute, since Albert's solution accepts both the pro and the contra arguments (for different readings of the sophisma).
In general, a sophisma provided a good opportunity to discuss all kinds of problems related to a specific theoretical issue. For example, the sophisma ‘Album fuit disputaturum’ (‘The white [thing] was about to dispute’) in thirteenth-century Parisian literature elicited discussions of the problems connected with the theory of reference in tensed contexts, and also provided an opportunity to refute the positions others held on this very controversial subject. This is why Pinborg 1977 (p. xv) says, with reference to the body of literature devoted to discussions of sophismata, that at Paris in the thirteenth century “the sophismata seems — within the faculty of arts — to play a role analogous to the Quaestiones quodlibetales [quodlibetal questions] in the faculty of theology.” The Catalogue of 13th Century Sophismata (Ebbesen and Goubier 2010) provides an extensive list of logical problems and distinctions that were brought up under the heading of a sophisma. Again, many grammatical problems were also dealt with in this way.
Sophismata and the Roles of Syncategorematic Words
It is important to recognize that many sophismata contain syncategorematic words that are responsible for their odd, ambiguous or puzzling character. Especially when more than one syncategorematic word occurs in one and the same sentence, it can be difficult to interpret. In the sophismata literature, the discussions of problematic sentences are usually accompanied by an explanation of the distinctions governing the use of syncategorematic words. In turn such distinctions can help to interpret the sentence at issue.
An example of such a distinction is the following. The sophisma ‘Only God being God is necessary’ (‘Tantum deum esse deum est necessarium’) contains the syncategorematic word ‘only’ (‘tantum’). The sophisma is solved by making a distinction between two different functions of the word ‘only’, in that the exclusion it makes can pertain to the expression ‘God’, or to the entire phrase ‘God being God’. In the former case the sentence is true, but in the latter it is false (Ebbesen and Goubier 2010, vol. I, p. 122). Another example of a problematic sentence containing the disjunctive expression ‘or’ is the sophisma ‘Every proposition or its contradictory opposite is true’. Some authors considered this proposition as true, but others thought it was ambiguous. In one way the distribution of ‘every’ could be taken as ranging over the disjunction; in this case the proposition reads ‘Any proposition or its contradictory is true’, which is true. In the second way the disjunction could be taken to cover the distribution: then the proposition reads ‘Every proposition is true or every contradictory opposite is true’, which is false. A last example of a distinction concerns the sophisma ‘The white can be black’ (this is an awkward translation of the sentence ‘Album potest esse nigrum’): the sentence can be taken to mean ‘The thing that is white can be black’, which is true; or it can be interpreted as ‘It can be the case that the white thing is black’ (at the same time, that is), in which case it is false. The truth or falsity of the proposition then depends on scope distinction of the expression ‘can be’.
The expression ‘syncategorematic word’ should be taken in a broad sense here: it includes not only classical syncategorematic words like ‘and’, ‘if’, ‘every’, etc., but also expressions like ‘infinite’ or ‘whole’, which can be used both categorematically and syncategorematically. Thus the sentence ‘Infinita sunt finita’ (‘The infinite are finite’ — this, incidentally, is another good example of a sophisma that cannot be translated into English without disambiguating it) is false if ‘infinite’ is used categorematically, for in that case it reads ‘Things that are infinite are finite.’ But it is true if ‘infinite’ is used syncategorematically, for in that case it reads ‘Finite things are infinite in number’ or ‘There are infinitely many finite things’ (See Heytesbury, Sophismata, sophisma xviii, fol.130va). This is another example of a kind of distinction that can solve the sophisma.
Many sophismata too are what medieval logicians called ‘exponible sentences’ (‘exponibilia); these are sentences that appear to be simple but actually imply several other sentences into which they can be decomposed. For example, the sentence ‘A differs from B’ was said to be equivalent to ‘A exists and B exists and A is not B’; the sentence ‘A ceases to be white’ was said to be equivalent either to ‘Now A is white and immediately after this A will not be white’ or to ‘Now A is not white and immediately before this A was white’, depending on the theory.
Discussions of sophismata were used to disentangle problems of logic and grammar, but their subject matter included concepts featured in physics and theology as well. While the problems at issue in the sophismata are taken as logico-grammatical, it is possible to distinguish between logical, grammatical and physical sophismata. Furthermore, many standard sophismata of the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries feature God or the Antichrist, entities that belong to the domain of theology. As Ebbesen (1997, p. 151) pointed out, these entities could play an interesting role in sophismatic discussions because they were considered to have unusual qualities, which could make for intriguing logical puzzles. Yet the occurrence of a theological sophisma as such is extremely rare.
As seen above, logical sophismata are closely connected to the discussions of syncategoremata. The aim of these discussions is to determine the truth-value of a particular sentence containing (a) syncategorematic word(s), or to determine the truth-value of some other problematic sentence (including, for example, sentences involving self-reference), but also to discuss specific topics that are exemplified in it, such as:
- The syntactic and semantic properties of terms (including the difference between what a term signifies, and what it stands for) in sentences like ‘Every man sees every man,’ ‘You are a donkey,’ and ‘I promise you a horse.’ We could compare these kinds of discussions to modern discussions of sentences like ‘The morning star is the evening star.’
- Quantification and existential import, as in the sentence ‘Every phoenix is.’
- The logic of negation and “infinite” words, as in the sentences ‘Nothing and a chimaera are brothers,’ ‘Nothing is nothing’ and ‘If nothing is, something is.’
- The problem of universals, as in ‘Man is a species,’ and ‘Man is of necessity an animal.’
- The composite and divided senses of a sentence and the scope of modal operators, as in ‘The white can be black,’ ‘Every man is of necessity an animal,’ etc.
- Scope distinctions in negations, as in ‘No one running you are a donkey.’
- Scope distinctions in a conditional containing a distributive sign (quantifier), as in ‘Nothing true if Socrates is running is antecedent to Plato running.’
- The truth value of conditional sentences containing an impossible antecedent, such as ‘If you know you are a stone, you do not know you are a stone.’
- The nature of necessity and possibility, as in sentences like ‘The soul of the Antichrist of necessity will be,’ ‘Every grammarian is of necessity a man,’ and ‘It is possible that every man is an animal,’ etc.
The aim here is to discuss concepts featuring in physics, such as motion, change, velocity, intension and remission of forms, maxima and minima, time, etc. Examples of sophismata in this domain are sentences containing the syncategoremata ‘begins’ and ‘ceases’: ‘Socrates ceases to be not ceasing to be,’ ‘Nothing is true except in this instant’ and ‘What begins to be ceases to be’. But, as seen above with the sophisma ‘The infinite are finite,’ problems like these are treated as logical and conceptual problems. This logico-semantical approach to physical problems is characteristic of medieval natural philosophy and should be kept in mind when we wonder to what extent medieval physics can be considered a precursor to modern physics.
With respect to so-called ‘physical sophismata,’ special attention should be paid to certain fourteenth century English authors known as the “Oxford Calculators”: authors such as Richard Kilvington, William Heytesbury, Thomas Bradwardine, Richard and Roger Swineshead. These people developed a peculiarly “English-style” of sophismata. Based on the theological doctrine of the absolute power of God, the distinction between what is physically possible and what is logically possible (where non-contradiction is the only limit) allowed these authors to devise imaginary thought experiments. For example, suppose that A is a distance to be traversed which Socrates cannot traverse, and that his power is increased until Socrates can traverse distance A completely, and that Socrates' power is not increased further: is the sophisma ‘Socrates will begin to be able to traverse distance A’ true or false? (Richard Kilvington, Sophismata, sophisma 27, in Kretzmann 1990, p.60). Thought experiments like these led these authors to develop, among other things, a theorem for uniformly accelerated motion (Thomas Bradwardine's “Mean Speed Theorem”).
Sophismata like ‘Love is a verb,’ ‘O Master,’ ‘It rueth me’ or ‘I run’ gave rise to very sharp discussions of grammatical categories and theories. For example, does a change in word order change the meaning of a proposition? Can a participle be a subject? How should we interpret interjections? Can ‘est’ (‘is’) be used impersonally?
Ebbesen has identified one sophisma that deserves the label ‘theological’ (in the sense, that is, of an “exception to the general rule that the sophisma is not a theological genre” (Ebbesen 1997, pp. 151-152). The sophisma in question runs: ‘Deus est eodem modo in dyabolo sicud fuit in beata virgine’(‘God is in the same way in the devil as he was in the Blessed Virgin“). The reason why this could count as a theological sophisma is that the question that is raised in it, about the nature of God's presence in creatures, is of a theological nature. Another theological candidate investigated by Ebbesen is the sophisma ‘Deus scit quicquid scivit’ (‘God knows whatever he has known’), which was widely discussed in the standard sophismata literature. The sentence elicits questions not only pertaining to the logical behaviour of the verb ‘scire’ (‘to know’), but also to the specifically theological issue of the object of God's knowledge (Ebbesen 1997, p. 154ff.).
The first and most evident role of sophismata is pedagogical. In theoretical treatises, sophismata can play various roles. They can be used to explain a given statement or rule, illustrate a distinction or an ambiguity, show what would follow if a rule were violated, or test the limits of a theory.
In addition, although some differences can be identified between the Paris and the Oxford traditions, sophismata are important as oral exercises (disputations) in a student's training in philosophy, especially in the first years of universitary education in the Faculty of Arts. Nevertheless, it is clear that, while Heytesbury's Rules for Solving Sophismata is written for undergraduate students — at Oxford ‘sophista’ was the official name given to students who had disputed “on sophismata” (“de sophismatibus”) for about two years — this is probably not the case for his Sophismata, in which the discussions are much more complicated.
It is no exaggeration to say that sophismata in the Faculty of Arts were as important as biblical exegesis in the Faculty of Theology.
In the Introduction of the Catalogue (Ebbesen and Goubier 2010, vol. I) we find an elaborate description of the medieval genre of sophismata. This genre was based on disputational practices in medieval universities. In its most basic form it included the discussion of a problematic proposition, beginning with the presentation of the proposition, followed by a proof, a disproof and a solution, sometimes accompanied by a response to the opposing arguments (see our section 2.2). The joint discsussion of these steps was known as corpus sophismatis. A respondent's solution to the sophisma could be followed by an attack, leading to yet another exchange of arguments. In other instances the discussion of the sophisma could continue with a discussion of related problems, the first of which was often dealt with in an elaborate way. These kinds of sophismata are quite long.
Sophismata are found in a variety of texts, which scholars have categorised into different kinds. Abstractiones treatises are collections of sophismata, which are arranged by a type of syncategorematic word (e.g. exceptive words, exclusive words, conditional words, disjunctive words, and so on), or sometimes by a distinction that is used to solve them. The material covered in each sophisma is mostly confined to a corpus. Syncategoremata are treatises devoted to syncategorematic words; in these treatises sophismata are used to illustrate or to give more refined explanations of the logical behaviour of the different syncategorematic words (or kinds of syncategorematic words). In Distinctiones treatises, the starting points are distinctions or logical rules connected with sentences that contain a syncategorematic word. The material in these treatises is usually organised around the type of syncategorematic word at issue. Besides these different kinds of treatises (the boundaries of which, however, are not very clear), we also find collections of sophismata that seem to be reports of oral disputations. These collections can contain grammatical sophismata, but the latter are also found in separate, rather loosely organised treatises. Sophismata also play an important role in general manuals of logic, and in works — often by the same authors, or by different authors coming from the same milieu as the former collections — with titles such as On Exponibles, On Consequences, Sophistry, etc.
Even if there are technical distinctions among these types of treatises, all of them play the same roles mentioned above: they provide students with logical skills that can be applied to any subject whatsoever.
The medieval sophismata-literature is a vast and complex area of research. Many questions are still unsolved, especially about its historical origins and development. It is of central interest for people interested in medieval logic, grammar and physics, but also for those interested in the history of universities.
The study of “sophismatic works” began around 1940 with Grabmann's Die Sophismatalitteratur des 12. und 13. Jahrhunderts, and much research has been done in the last two decades. In 2010 The Catalogue of 13th Century ‘sophismata’ (Ebbesen and Goubier) became available, which contains a host of information about recent scholarship in the field of sophismata (Ebbesen and Goubier 2010, Vol. I, pp. 7-9). It also lists all the editions of sophismata literature available up to that date, as well as all the manuscripts the compilers had managed to investigate. It is an invaluable source of information for those wishing to continue the research of sophismata. There are still many texts to read, edit and analyze.
The bibliography for this entry, which is far from exhaustive, is organized as follows:
- Primary Literature (in alphabetical order by medieval authors)
- Translations (in alphabetical order by medieval authors)
- Secondary Literature (in alphabetical order by modern authors).
Most of the logical and grammatical texts on sophismata have been edited by S. Ebbesen and his collaborators in the review Cahiers de l'Institut du Moyen Age Grec et Latin, University of Copenhagen. We will here mention only books.
- De Libera, A. César et le Phénix. Distinctiones et sophismata parisiens du XIIIe siècle. Centro di cultura medievale, 4; Pisa: Scuola Normale Superiore, 1991.
- De Rijk, L. M. Some Earlier Parisian Tracts on Distinctiones sophismatum. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 1988.
- Scott, T. K. Johannes Buridanus. ‘Sophismata’. Critical Edition with an Introduction. Grammatica Speculativa, 1; Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1977.
- Pironet, Fabienne. Iohanni Buridani Summularum Tractatus nonus: De practica sophismatum (Sophismata). Critical Edition and Introduction. Turnhout, Brépols, 2004, li + 193 p.
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B. E. The ‘Sophismata’ of Richard Kilvington. Oxford: University Press for The British Academy, 1990. (Critical edition.)
- Spruyt, Joke. Matthew of Orléans. Sophistaria sive summa communium distinctionum circa sophismata accidentium Leiden, Brill, 2001.
- Pinborg, J. Sigerus de Cortraco, ‘Summa modorum significandi sophismata’; New Edition, on the Basis of G. Wallerand's editio prima, with Additions, Critical Notes, an Index of Terms and an Introduction. Amsterdam: J. Benjamins, 1977.
- Longeway, J. William Heytesbury: On Maxima and Minima. Chapter 5 of ‘Rules for Solving Sophismata’, with an Anonymous Fourteenth Century Discussion, a Translation with an Introduction and Study. Synthese Historical Library, 26; Dordrecht: Reidel, 1984.
- Pironet, Fabienne, Guillaume Heytesbury, Sophismata asinina. Une introduction aux disputes médiévales. Présentation, édition critique et analyse. Collection Sic et Non; Paris: Vrin, 1994. (With texts from the Libelli sophistarum ad usum Oxoniensis.)
- Scott, T. K. Sophisms on Meaning and Truth. New York: Appleton Century Crofts, 1966. (Translation of John Buridan's Sophismata.)
- Biard, J. Jean Buridan, Sophismes. Collection Sic et Non; Paris: Vrin, 1993.
- Hughes, G. E. John Buridan on Self-Reference. Chapter Eight of Buridan's ‘Sophismata’. An Edition and a Translation with an Introduction and a Philosophical Commentary. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982. (The paperbound edition omits the Latin text.)
- Kretzmann, N., and Kretzmann, B.E. The ‘Sophismata’ of Richard Kilvington. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990. (English translation, historical introduction and philosophical commentary.)
Many important studies are to be found in the following collective work: S. Read (ed.), Sophisms in Medieval Logic and Grammar (Acts of the Ninth European Symposium for Medieval Logic and Semantics, St. Andrews, June 1990), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1993.
- Biard, J., 1989, “Les sophismes du savoir: Albert de Saxe entre Jean Buridan et Guillaume Heytesbury.” Vivarium, 27: 36-50.
- –––, 1990, “Verbes cognitifs et appellation de la forme selon Albert de Saxe,” in S. Knuuttila, R. Työrinoja, and S. Ebbesen, ed. Knowledge and the Sciences in Medieval Philosophy. Proceedings of the Eighth International Congress of Medieval Philosophy (S.I.E.P.M.). Helsinki, 24-29 August 1987, Helsinki: Yliopistopaino, Vol. II, pp. 427-35.
- Braakhuis, H.A.G., 1979, De 13de Eeuwse Tractaten over Syncategorematische Termen. Inleidende Studie en Uitgave van Nicolaas van Parijs' Syncategoremata, Nijmegen (diss.).
- Ebbesen, S., 1979, “The Dead Man is Alive,” Synthese 40: 43-70.
- –––, 1997, “Doing Theology with Sophismata,” in C. Marmo(ed.), Vestigia, imagines, verba: Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts (XIIth-XIVth Century), Semiotic and Cognitive Studies 4, Turnhout: Brepols, 151-169.
- Ebbesen, S, and Braakhuis, H.A.G., 1997, “Anonymi Erfordensis (= Roberti Kilwardby?) Sophisma TANTUM UNUM EST,” CIMAGL, 67: 105-125.
- Ebbesen, S, and Goubier, F., 2010, A Catalogue of 13th-Century Sophismata, Part I: Introduction and Indices; Part II: Catalogue of Sophismata, Paris.
- Grabmann, M., 1940, Die Sophismatenliteratur des 12. und 13. Jahrhunderts mit Textausgabe eines Sophisma des Boetius von Dacien, Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie une Theologie des Mittelalters. Texte und Untersuchungen, Band 36, Heft 1, Münster i. W.: Aschendorff.
- Knuuttila, S. and Lehtinen, A. I., 1979, “Plato in infinitum remisse incipit esse albus. New Texts on the Late Medieval Discussion on the Concept of Infinity in Sophismata Literature,” in E. Saarinen, R. Hilpinen, I. Niiniluoto, M. P. Hintikka (eds.), Essays in Honour of J. Hintikka (Synthese Library 124), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 309-29.
- Kretzmann, N., 1982, “Syncategoremata, exponibilia, sophismata,” in N. Kretzmann, et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100-1600, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 211-45.
- –––, 1982, “Continuity, Contrariety, Contradiction and Change,” in N. Kretzmann (ed.), Infinity and Continuity in Ancient and Medieval Thought (Papers Presented at a Conference held at Cornell University on April 20 and 21 1979, under the Title ‘Infinity, Continuity and Indivisibility in Antiquity and the Middle Ages’), Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 322-40. (Appendix: “Text of Walter Burleigh and the Sophisms 8 and 16 of Richard Kilvington.”)
- –––, 1988, “Tu scis hoc esse omne quod est hoc: Richard Kilvington and the Logic of Knowledge,” in N. Kretzmann (ed.), Meaning and Inference in Medieval Philosophy. Studies in Memory of Jan Pinborg, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 225-45.
- de Libera, A., 1986, “La littérature des Sophismata dans la tradition terministe parisienne de la seconde moitié du XIIIe siècle,” in M. Asztalos (ed.) The Editing of Theological and Philosophical Texts from the Middle Ages (Acts of the Conference Arranged by the Department of Classical Languages, University of Stockholm, 29-31 August 1984), Acta universitatis Stockholmiensis, Studia Latina Stockholmiensia, 30, Stockholm: Almqvist and Wiksell International, 213-44.
- –––, 1983, “La littérature des Abstractiones et la tradition logique d'Oxford,” in P. O. Lewry (ed.), The Rise of British Logic. Acts of the Sixth European Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics (Balliol College, Oxford, 19-24 June 1983), Papers in Mediaeval Studies, 7, Toronto, Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies, 63-114.
- –––, 1989, “La problématique de l' ’instant du changement’ au XIIIe siècle: contribution à l'histoire des sophismata physicalia,” in S. Carloti (ed.) Studies in Medieval Natural Philosophy, Florence: Leo S. Olschki, 43-93.
- Murdoch, J. E., 1982, “Mathematics and Sophisms in Late Medieval Natural Philosophy,” in Les genres littéraires dans les sources théologiques et philosophiques médiévales (Actes du colloque international de Louvain-la-Neuve, 25-27 mai 1981), Université Catholique de Louvain, Publications de l'Institut Supérieur d'Etudes Médiévales. Deuxième Série: Textes, Etudes, Congrès, 5; Louvain-la-Neuve: Institut d'Etudes Médiévales de L'Université Catholique de Louvain, 85-100.
- –––, 1982, “Infinity and Continuity,” in N. Kretzmann, et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy from the Rediscovery of Aristotle to the Disintegration of Scholasticism, 1100-1600, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 564-91.
- Rosier, I., 1991, “Les sophismes grammaticaux au XIIIe siècle,” Medioevo, 17: 175-230.
- Rosier, I. and Roy, B., 1990, “Grammaire et liturgie dans les sophismes du XIIIe siècle,” Vivarium, 28: 118-35.
- Sylla, E. D., 1981, “William Heytesbury on the Sophism infinita sunt finita,” in Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter (Akten des 6. Internationalen Kongresses für mittelalterliche Philosophie der Société Internationale pour l'étude de la philosophie médiévale, 29. August-3. September 1977 im Bonn), Miscellanea Mediaevalia, 13.1-2, Berlin: W. de Gruyter, 1981, Vol.II, 628-36.
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- William Heytesbury: Sophismata (working text of the Latin):
- William Heytesbury and Robert Alyngton: Tractatus Juxta hunc textum
- Paul Spade's Mediaeval Logic and Philosophy page site.
- Sophismata Project: Publications Université de Genè